Truth and Truthmakers

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D.M. Armstrong, Truth and Truthmakers, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 170pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521547237.

Reviewed by Kristopher McDaniel, Syracuse University


D.M. Armstrong’s latest book, Truth and Truthmakers, is a formidable yet compact treatise on the metaphysics of truthmaking. It will be widely studied and hotly debated by contemporary analytic metaphysicians.

In this book, Armstrong is concerned to explicate the relation between a truth and what makes the truth true. Appropriately enough, Armstrong calls this relation the “truthmaking relation.” He defends the following claims about the truthmaking relation:

(1) The truthmaking relation is (primarily) a relation between a proposition and something (typically) non-propositional, specifically, the thing that makes the proposition true. (5, 12-16)

(2) The truthmaking relation is an internal relation: the truthmaking relation is necessitated by the qualitative character of the things it relates. (9)

(3) Truthmaker Maximalism: For any true proposition p, there is an x that makes p true. (5-7)

(4) Truthmaker Necessitarianism: If x makes p true, then, necessarily, if x exists, then p is true. (5-7)

In addition to defending claims about the truthmaking relation, Armstrong also advances several interesting claims about the relata of the truthmaking relation. Chapter one is an introduction; chapter two contains a discussion of Armstrong’s theory of propositions; chapter three addresses the methodological and epistemological issues associated with truthmaking theory; chapter four provides an extended account of Armstrong’s new theory of properties, objects, and states of affairs; chapters five and six discuss Armstrong’s account of the truthmakers for negative and general truths, e.g., “There is no cat on the carpet” and “all philosophers are charming”; chapters seven and eight deal with Armstrong’s minimalist theory of modality; chapter nine concerns itself with the ontology of mathematics; chapter ten deals with causation and the nature of laws of nature; finally, chapter eleven discusses the metaphysics of time. And all in only one-hundred and seventy pages — counting the references and the index! — and all written in Armstrong’s trademark clear, even-handed, and unpretentious style.

Philosophers will have much to learn from this book, and they may teach from it as well. In addition to advancing the debate, Truth and Truthmaking contains a lot of helpful expository material. Each chapter clarifies the issues with which it deals. Armstrong’s positions and those with which he contends are nicely presented and carefully contrasted. The book could be used in a graduate metaphysics seminar or even an advanced undergraduate philosophy class.

I’ll concentrate the remainder of this review on the accounts of propositions, properties, and objects defended in this rich and stimulating book.


Armstrong takes propositions to be the primary bearers of truth-values. Propositions are one of the relata of the truthmaking relation. As noted above, Armstrong holds that the truthmaking relation is an internal relation, i.e., a relation that supervenes on the qualitative character of its relata. Armstrong notes that this fact rules out some candidates for being propositions: “how can truthmakers necessitate truthbearers if the truthbearers are beliefs, statements, and so on?” (15) So what then are propositions?

Armstrong’s answer to this question is difficult to assess. He considers several answers en route to his final view. Rejected candidates include: Platonic entities outside the realm of space-time, sets of sentences and beliefs equivalent in meaning or content, and properties of beliefs and sentences, which could be thought of as the meanings of the sentences or beliefs. Armstrong is attracted to the last of these options, but notes that this view is problematic: some of these properties must be uninstantiated. This is because there are true propositions that have never been entertained let alone believed or expressed; accordingly, these true propositions cannot be identified with properties of actual beliefs or sentences. One option is to hold that these propositions are properties that possible beliefs or sentences could instantiate. But Armstrong tells us that we should not accept uninstantiated properties. (15) However, Armstrong hopes to give us a deflationary account of uninstantiated properties, which he claims we could accept:

Properties of things are, I think, ways that things are, and the notion of a way that nothing is seems ontologically near unintelligible. I would find an account of unexpressed properties acceptable only if a deflationary account of these uninstantiated properties is given. We can do this deflation, I hope, by equating these uninstantiated properties with the mere possibility of the instantiation of such a property. It will then be necessary, of course, to consider what the truthmakers are for these truths of mere possibility. (15-16)

What is perplexing about Armstrong’s position is that, strictly speaking, he does not believe in mere possibilities. One can say that the fat man in the doorway is a mere possibility without committing oneself to a merely possible object; one simply expresses that it is possible that there is a fat man in the doorway. Similarly, one who holds that uninstantiated properties are mere possibilities is committed to nothing more than it being possible that certain properties are instantiated. (See p. 87 for more discussion of this issue.)

So if one holds that some propositions are uninstantiated properties, which are in turn taken to be mere possibilities, then it seems that one should say that, strictly speaking, there aren’t these propositions. Consider some far-away star that no one ever has or ever will contemplate. We would like to say that there are propositions about this star, such as the proposition that the star is burning at a particular intensity. This proposition is taken by Armstrong to be an uninstantiated property, a property that possible beliefs or sentences could have. But none of these items — uninstantiated properties, possible beliefs or sentences, and possible but non-actual properties — are in Armstrong’s official ontology; there is no object that Armstrong believes in that can be identified with the proposition that the star is burning is at a particular intensity, just as there is no object in Armstrong’s official ontology that can be identified with a possible fat man in my doorway.

And if these propositions aren’t actually in the ontology, then they don’t stand in internal relations to things that actually are in the ontology. Compare: since there are no merely possible fat people, there are no merely possible fat people that are taller than me. (Even though it is of course true that it is possible that a fat person is taller than me.) So in many cases, one of the relata of the truthmaking relation will be absent from the ontology. So it is hard to see how the truthmaking relation can be an internal relation.

Properties and Objects

Armstrong’s views on the nature of properties and objects have profoundly changed since his last book. Armstrong now holds the following:

(1) If an object x instantiates a property F, then x and F are partially identical; they share a common constituent. (47) Armstrong extends this principle to relations as well (49, 52, 126); see also Armstrong 2005, p. 318.

(2) If x and y are partially identical, then, necessarily, x exists if and only if y exists. (47)

These are powerful claims. Suppose a instantiates F; given these claims, necessarily, a exists if and only if F exists. Because of this, Armstrong holds that states of affairs are no longer needed as “ontological additions”; the existence of the state of affairs in which a is F supervenes on the existence of a and F. (48-49) Armstrong also hopes that appealing to (1) and (2) will help solve puzzles about the nature of the laws of nature. (126-136)

Armstrong’s motivations for adopting (1) and (2) are not explained in much depth; with respect to (1), he tells us that he has been convinced by Donald Baxter (2001) that it is true and leaves things at that. He does not provide much of an argument for (2); he writes:

Suppose a to be F, with F a universal. If this state of affairs is contingent, then it might not have existed. Suppose it had not existed. The particular a, the particular with all its non-relational properties, would not have existed. Something quite like it could have existed instead: a particular with all of a‘s properties except F. But that would have only been a close counterpart of a, because the intersection with F, the partial identity with F, would be lacking. Equally, it now seems to me that the universal F would not have existed. A universal very like F could have existed: a universal that had the same instantiations as F except for its instantiating a. (47)

There are two problems with this defense. First, as an argument for (2), it seems question-begging. In general, it doesn’t seem that if two things are partially identical, then they are strongly modally interconnected. A piece of flesh on the tip of my finger and me are partially identical; but it certainly seems as though I could exist without the piece of flesh existing. Why should the situation be different when the two entities in question are a universal and its instantiator?

Second, and more seriously, given (1) and (2), most of the quoted paragraph is false. Grant (1) and (2), and consider an a that is F, G, and H. If the property F had not existed, not only would a not have existed, but G and H and any other property had by a would not have existed either. a and F are partially identical and so are a and G. So, necessarily, a exists if and only if F exists; and, similarly, a exists if and only if G exists. So F exists if and only if G exists, and so forth for any property had by a. So if a had not existed, there would not have been a “close counterpart” of a, one that had all of a’s properties save for F. None of a‘s properties would have existed! Moreover, if F had not existed, no “close counterpart” of F would have existed. Suppose a, b, c, and d all instantiate F. Suppose b, c, and d all instantiate H. By similar reasoning, necessarily, a exists if and only if b, c, and d exist; H exists only if b, c, and d exists. So if a doesn’t exist, then H doesn’t exist either.

If (1) and (2) are right, then the world suffers from a disturbing interconnectivity. Elsewhere, Armstrong has indicated his willingness to extend the doctrine of partial identity to cover particulars standing in relations to each other. Presumably, Armstrong holds that everything is spatiotemporally related to everything else, since this seems to follow from his naturalism. This seems to imply that every particular object is partially identical to every other particular object. Given (2), had I not been born, you never would have existed. Moreover, had I not been born, no property instantiated by anything in this universe would have existed, and hence, nothing in this universe would have existed. Armstrong’s (1) and (2) jointly imply that the world is disastrously modally fragile.1 At least one of (1) or (2) should be abandoned.2

Works Cited

Armstrong, D.M. 2005. “Four Disputes about Properties”, Synthese 144: 309-320.

Baxter, Donald. 2001. “Instantiation as Partial Identity”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 79: 449-464.