Truth as One and Many

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Michael P. Lynch, Truth as One and Many, Oxford UP, 2009, x+205pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199218738.

Reviewed by Stewart Shapiro, The Ohio State University/Arché Research Centre, University of St. Andrews



There are two bodies of philosophical literature on truth. One of these is concerned with the metaphysical nature of truth (or whether it has such a nature). Authors defend and attack varieties of truth-as-correspondence, truth-as-coherence, deflationism, and the like. The present book is a contribution to this enterprise. The other body of literature concerns the paradoxes. It seems that there is very little overlap between these bodies, and this book is no exception. At the end of the introduction, Michael Lynch writes:

Some issues of profound importance, particularly formal issues regarding the semantic paradoxes, are regretfully left untouched. I make no apology for this. Trying to get a full picture of truth is like trying to get a full picture of the world; it is only possible from very far away.

The view Lynch articulates in his book is a valiant attempt to synthesize the most compelling features of the range of views on truth. It brings exciting new life to the enterprise, and should be required for anyone with even a passing interest in the metaphysical issues.

Advocates of truth-as-correspondence and advocates of truth-as-coherence both have it that there is a single underlying nature of truth, but they disagree as to what this nature is. Lynch argues that each of these views is correct, in a sense, but only for a chunk of discourse. Against both of these theories, deflationists argue that there is no substantial, underlying nature of truth. Lynch rejects deflationism, holding that truth does have a nature, but he agrees with deflationists that the realm of discourse is too diverse for any single first-level property, such as correspondence or coherence, to fully characterize truth.

He presents a functionalist theory. The definition is this:

(F) (x) x is true if, and only if, x has a property that plays the truth-role. (p. 72)

According to Lynch, the truth-role is given in terms of what he calls the “core truisms” of our folk concept of truth. These are platitudes that hold of the everyday notion, and are such that anyone who rejects all (or most) of them can be accused of changing the subject. He identifies three such truisms:

Objectivity: The belief that p is true if and only if with respect to the belief that p, things are as they are believed to be. (p. 8)

Norm of Belief: It is prima facie correct to believe that p if and only if the proposition that p is true. (p. 10)

End of Inquiry: Other things being equal, true beliefs are a worthy goal of inquiry. (p. 12)

The list, however, is negotiable. Lynch leaves open that there may be other core truisms that should be included, and that perhaps some of the ones he lists might be replaced by others, or articulated differently.

A given property T plays the truth-role for a batch of propositions just in case, for any proposition P in the batch:

P is T if, and only if, where P is believed, things are as they are believed to be; other things being equal, it is a worthy goal of inquiry to believe P if P is T; it is correct to believe P if and only if P is T … (p. 72, ellipsis in original)

So, for Lynch, truth is one, since the above functionalist definition gives the correct characterization of the metaphysical nature of truth. And truth is many since for different stretches of discourse — for different batches of propositions - there are different properties that play the truth role.

We are given only two candidates for properties that play the truth-role in different stretches of discourse. As might be expected, one is a variety of correspondence and the other a variety of coherence. Lynch provides an interesting and insightful connection between the metaphysical notion of correspondence-with-reality and representational theories of the mind, from cognitive science and the philosophy of language. For simple predications, the underlying idea is this:

REPRESENT: The belief that <α> is F is true if and only if the object denoted by <α> has the property denoted by <F>. (p. 24)

The theory should then be filled in with an account of how concepts pick out properties. Lynch does not provide details, indicating that his overall theory will work for a number of theories of denotation. But he gives two “toy” examples. One of these is causal: the concept , for example, denotes cats if “cats cause, under appropriate conditions, mental tokenings of ”. The other toy account is teleological: denotes cats if “the biological function of is to be mentally tokened in the presence of cats”.

The upshot of this representation/correspondence account is that it works for a given batch of propositions only if our minds are responsive to whatever those propositions are about. As Lynch puts it,

Say that a given mental state has G-ish content if the proposition that is that content has G‘s as its subject. A correspondence theory … will seem likely as a theory of truth for such states only when we can establish

Responsiveness: Mental states with G-ish content are causally responsive to an external environment that contains G’s.

In a bumper sticker, if we are to correspond, we must respond. (p. 32)

Lynch thus argues that correspondence accounts of truth are vulnerable to a “scope problem”. They do not apply to discourses whose propositions are not about objects and properties to which humans are directly responsive. In particular, correspondence fails for moral discourse and mathematical discourse. So it is not the case, across the board, that truth is correspondence.

The beauty of Lynch’s functionalist theory is that he can note this, but point out that representation/correspondence can and does play the truth-role for discourses about objects and properties to which we are responsive. Discourse concerning observable properties about medium-sized physical objects is a case in point. For such propositions, truth is correspondence, in a sense.

The other candidate for a property to play the truth role, a sort of coherence notion, is derived from Crispin Wright’s notion of superassertability. This candidate, which Lynch calls “super-coherence”, also suffers from a scope problem. It does not provide a decent account of truth for some discourses about objects and properties for which we are responsive. More importantly, coherence theories fail to account for their own theoretical talk. The proposition that truth is (super)coherence is not itself true in virtue of the coherence of that statement. In general, the proposition that a given proposition P is coherent is not itself true in virtue of the coherence of the proposition "P is coherent". Again, these observations are grist for the functionalist mill. In the final chapter, Lynch argues in some detail that a variety of super-coherence plays the truth role for moral discourse.

Of course, the book contains a lot of detail, replies to criticisms, suggestions for solving local problems, and the like. Even so, as Lynch notes, the presented account of truth is only an outline or a framework. The real philosophical work that lays ahead would be to show how the realm of propositions is to be divided up into the relevant batches, and to develop, in detail, the properties that play the truth role for each batch. The book concludes

The overall picture of truth given here is abstract. But of course, that is part of the point. This book has been about truth itself — and truth itself, the functionalist theory claims, is a rather abstract property. But it is also a property that comes in more than one form. If that is right, then philosophical progress lies in investigating those forms, in discovering how truth manifests itself across the spectrum of our thought. (p. 192)

In this spirit, I will make a few observations as to the applicability of the account to various spectrums of thought. I presume that the account of super-coherence is put forward as a serious candidate for the truth role for moral discourse. The same does not go for the representation/correspondence property proposed for typical propositions about medium-sized physical objects. That is more of a toy example. Given the way the account is presented and motivated, it does not even extend to propositions about non-medium-sized physical objects, nor to even to mildly theoretical statements about medium-sized physical objects. Consider the propositions expressed by the following sentences:

My tire is inflated with nitrogen.

The gravitational field around the earth is several times as strong as the gravitational field around the moon.

Clearly, nothing like the above “toy” accounts of denotation will work for concepts like and . To belabor the obvious, nitrogen does not “cause, under appropriate conditions, mental tokenings of” , nor can we say that denotes nitrogen if “the biological function of” “is to be mentally tokened in presence of” nitrogen . For one thing, we are (almost) always in the presence of nitrogen. Similarly, mental states with gravitational-field-ish content are not causally responsive to an external environment that contains gravitational fields. Every external environment contains a gravitational field.

Nevertheless, Lynch does seem attracted to a correspondence based property to play the truth role for medium-sized physical objects. Given the connection with large objects, small objects, and theoretical properties, and given the failure of positivist-style protocol languages for pure observation statements, the correspondence property in question will have to be quite sophisticated. Moreover, it won’t be subject to anything like the above responsiveness constraint that motivates the scope argument. There may nevertheless be a scope problem for the envisioned correspondence based property, but we’ll have to wait for details to find out what it is.

Next, consider a discourse that is near and dear to my own heart, mathematics. Lynch does mention simple mathematical propositions in several places in the book, mostly to make trouble for some other accounts of truth, but the book does not contain a proposal for what would play the truth role for mathematics. This is fair enough, as the scope of the book is limited. As Lynch notes, it is clear that at least the toy correspondence/representation property will not work for mathematical propositions, as we do not respond to facts about mathematical objects and properties (if such there be). The obvious alternative would be some sort of coherence. It is part of Lynch’s methodology to be as neutral as possible on philosophical issues other than the direct matter at hand — the nature of truth. So, I would think that an account of the truth role for mathematical discourse should be available to those of us with realist intuitions. Well, maybe not, but surely the functionalist theory as a whole should be available to philosophers of all stripes. Perhaps a nominalist would propose one sort of property to play the truth-role, and a realist would propose another.

Just about any coherence account — including the one Lynch develops for moral discourse — involves the notion of consistency, and that is itself a mathematical matter. Consider the true proposition that there are infinitely many prime numbers. That is true in virtue of its coherence, supposedly. That, in turn, will involve the consistency of, say, Peano arithmetic. So what of the true proposition that Peano arithmetic is consistent? That is true in virtue of its coherence, and this will involve a further statement of consistency, say that of Zermelo Fraenkel set theory. What of the coherence of that? That will involve a statement of consistency. Gödel’s second incompleteness theorem is, in effect, that no consistent formal system can settle its own consistency. Well, the second incompleteness theorem is true. In virtue of its coherence? Coherence with what?

Actually, this is of-a-piece with an argument that Lynch himself brings against global coherence accounts. As noted, he takes advocates of such accounts to task for not being able to accommodate their own statements of coherence. He writes that we "can insist that what makes a given … framework coherent … is not a matter for that system to decide" (p. 174, emphasis in original). Consider some true propositions in the following forms:

S is a super-coherent system.

P is super-coherent with system S.

Lynch argues that these cannot be true in virtue of their super-coherence with the given system S. So either those propositions are true in virtue of some other property, or else they are true in virtue of super-coherence with some other system S*. So either we have an infinite regress, or we will eventually have to ground super-coherence claims like these in some non-coherence property, presumably some sort of correspondence.

The same goes for mathematics. Here, however, it seems to me that there is no escape from mathematics. There is no outside perspective where we can assess mathematical statements along some other dimension, unless it be on some sort of correspondence-cum-platonist ground. But, as above, the functionalist account is supposed to be available to philosophers of all stripes.

Although, as noted, the paradoxes are not on the agenda, we are in danger of coming up against Tarski’s theorem on the undefinability of truth. Lynch shows how to derive the T-scheme:

TS: The proposition that p is true if, and only if, p. (p. 9)

from the core truisms and other commonly accepted platitudes. Lynch proposes that it is a requirement on any theory of truth that it explain (or explain away) the truisms. So any theory has to have the instances of TS consequences (or else explain TS away). But if the above observation — that there is no perspective outside mathematics from which to assess it — is correct, and we are not going to explain TS away, then it seems that a truth theory for mathematics would yield a definition of truth for mathematical discourse. That is, the functionalist theory, properly filled in, would be a theory from which one could derive something like the instances of TS for the language of mathematics. But Tarski’s theorem is that no consistent system (with classical or intuitionistic logic) can have its own truth-definition, in this sense.

As noted, this may just be a sharp version of Lynch’s argument against global-coherence: we "can insist that what makes a given … framework coherent … is not a matter for that system to decide". It shows that the account we end up with for mathematical truth — whether it be coherence-based or not — cannot be a part of mathematics. Well, that is just a matter of drawing boundaries between discourses. The argument also shows that the account of the truth-property for mathematics will have to be richer and more expressive than mathematical discourse. And we will also want an account of the truth-property for the discourse in which the truth property for mathematics is given. This, of course, is just a version of the orthodox discussion of Tarskian truth, with the associated hierarchy, transposed into the present metaphysical context.

The topics broached above — large and small physical objects, theoretical properties, and mathematics — bear on each other. Given the state of science, statements about physical objects — even those that are medium-sized — are shot through with mathematics. Lynch does discuss mixed discourses, mostly to illustrate how moral and non-moral discourse interact in reasoning. That treatment, however, presupposes that atomic propositions can be neatly divided into groups based on their content. It is a matter of showing how truth is preserved through inferences involving compounds of such crisply separated atomic propositions. Something else is needed here, as mathematical and non-mathematical concepts can appear together in (what appear to be) atomic propositions. Consider, for example,

(i) The acceleration due to gravity near the surface of the earth is 9.8 meters per second per second.

(ii) The gravitational force between my favorite baseball and your favorite bat is inversely proportional to the square of the distance between their centers of gravity.

The envisioned functionalist account, with the details filled in, would provide the property that plays the truth role for such propositions (assuming that the same property works for both of them). I would think that this property would be the same as the one that plays the truth role for the propositions expressed by “my favorite baseball is round” and “the real numbers are densely ordered”, since (i) is also about baseballs — it is what Lynch would call “baseball-ish” — and (i) and (ii) are both about real numbers — they are real-number-ish. But that is mere speculation.

My final comment is a suggestion for a friendly amendment to the functionalist theory. As presupposed above, Lynch takes propositions to be the primary bearers of truth, for more or less standard reasons. Although he claims that the functionalist theory of truth is compatible with a number of proposals on the nature of propositions, he puts forward a functionalist account of them. The idea is that propositions are whatever plays a certain functional role. One key element is this:

Contents: Propositions are the objects of our propositional attitudes: they are what is believed and disbelieved. (p. 131)

Lynch’s treatment also assumes that propositions have some sort of sentential structure: there are atomic propositions, conjunctions, disjunctions, negations, etc. So each proposition is made up of atomic components, in much the same way that sentences are (at least in formal languages).

What of quantification? Consider the propositions expressed by

Every set has a powerset.

In Euclidean space, there is a straight line between any two points.

For each space-time point x within 100 miles of the earth’s surface, and for each space-time point within 100 miles of the moon’s surface, the gravitational field at x is greater than the gravitational force at y.

It is not clear how to think of these as somehow composed of atomic propositions, especially on the functionalist account. What does it mean to have a propositional attitude about a particular point in Euclidean space?

Whether it is functionalist or not, I presume we would want the account of propositions to be compositional. My friendly amendment follows the lead of Tarski (even though his concern was with the paradoxes and not the present metaphysical matters). I suggest that the overall theory be re-written as a functionalist account of satisfaction, a relation between sequences of objects and relations. I don’t know if it is possible to come up with a list of core truisms for the folk concept of satisfaction, since there may be no such folk concept — unless it is the concept underlying the locution “true of”. Nevertheless it should be possible to articulate its functional role and to speculate on the range of relations that play this role in various stretches of discourse. I do not know how amenable this suggestion is to the intuitions that underlie the treatment in this book, but, for what it is worth, I don’t see any other way of bringing mathematics and science into the fold. In any case, the spirit of the book would be maintained. Since truth can defined in terms of satisfaction, a functionalist pluralism about satisfaction would be a functionalist pluralism about truth.

Acknowledgments: Thanks to Kevin Scharp and Michael Lynch for helpful comments on a draft of this review.