Truth by Analysis: Games, Names, and Philosophy

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Colin McGinn, Truth by Analysis: Games, Names, and Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 189pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199856145.

Reviewed by Kristoffer Ahlstrom-Vij, University of Copenhagen


Recently, many philosophers have grown increasingly pessimistic about the epistemic merits of what is often considered the primary method of philosophical inquiry, namely, conceptual analysis. McGinn takes such pessimism to be uncalled for, and his book is a bold attempt to defend conceptual analysis as the proper method of philosophy. To McGinn, conceptual analysis is not a mere preliminary mapping of our "folk concepts," serving as a prelude to serious metaphysics (Jackson 1998) or scientific epistemology (Goldman 1992). Rather, it is nothing short of an investigation into "the essences of things" (93), and "the sole occupation of the philosopher" (ibid.), even if today often "practiced under the table by other names" (11). McGinn's aim vis-à-vis conceptual analysts is, therefore, to "release them from the closet, loosen their inhibitions, and improve their self-esteem" (ibid.).

In the service of this aim, McGinn spends roughly the first half of the book arguing that conceptual analysis is historically prominent (chapter 1), possible (chapters 2-4 and 6), worthwhile (chapter 5), and the sole job of the philosopher (chapter 7). The remainder of the book deals with some remaining challenges to (chapters 8-9) and applications of (chapters 11-12) the resulting conception of analysis, and argues that philosophy is a form of play, as contrasted with work (chapter 10). In light of the vast philosophical area covered by the book, it is unfortunate that McGinn fails to take into account crucial parts of the literature with a real bearing on his meta-philosophical project. (It is illustrative to note that the book's reference list is a mere page and a half.) In the interest of space, I will in what follows focus on a dual claim with respect to which McGinn's oversights become particularly problematic, given current meta-philosophical debates: that conceptual analysis is possible and worthwhile.

Let us start with the claim that conceptual analysis is possible. Traditionally, a conceptual analysis provides necessary and sufficient conditions for the proper application of a concept. Wittgenstein famously argued that it is impossible to provide necessary conditions for concepts. For example, there is no one feature -- no necessary condition -- in virtue of which all games qualify as games. If Wittgenstein is right, conceptual analysis, as traditionally understood, is impossible. Inspired by Bernard Suits' The Grasshopper (1978), McGinn argues that Wittgenstein is wrong; there are concepts that can be broken down into necessary (and even jointly sufficient) conditions, and 'game' is one such concept. A game, Suits proposes, is a voluntary attempt to overcome unnecessary obstacles.

Let us assume that Suit's analysis holds up to critical scrutiny. Even so, this does not give us reason to believe that necessary and jointly sufficient conditions can be provided for a wide variety of philosophically interesting concepts. To make that claim plausible, McGinn would have had to address psychological theories implying that 'game,' if it has a traditional analysis, would constitute the exception rather than the rule. For example, on one influential psychological theory -- prototype theory -- items are categorized as falling under a concept to the extent that they are taken to share a sufficient number of salient features with typical instances of that concept.[1] As William Ramsey (1998) has pointed out, this presents a problem for the conceptual analyst since it suggests that intuitive counterexamples to alleged necessary conditions will be abundant: many things share some significant set of salient features with a typical instance, without each such thing sharing a single property (a necessary condition).

Unfortunately, however, McGinn makes no mention of prototype theory, nor of the challenge it presents to the conceptual analyst. And this challenge is only the beginning, as far as the analysis of philosophically interesting concepts is concerned. For example, even assuming that we can identify a necessary condition for our concept of knowledge (e.g., that all knowledge is factive) the main challenge has turned out to be to identify necessary and jointly sufficient conditions. McGinn is optimistic, however, and suggests that "the mere fact of failure so far does not prove that further efforts will inevitably fail -- obviously" (37). At the same time, he notes that "it would be nice if we could actually supply the analysis that I am claiming must exist" (42), and goes on to provide an analysis of knowledge in terms of true belief that is not true by a "fluke." Rather than spelling out what it is to be a "fluke," however, he suggests that "we can complete the analysis of knowledge without committing ourselves about exactly what conditions rule out epistemic flukes" (44, fn. 9).

But surely that is to set the bar for successful analysis too low. As pointed out by Duncan Pritchard (2005), the interesting philosophical question is not whether knowledge is incompatible with some form of luck (or "fluke") -- that, Pritchard notes, is something of a platitude -- but what kind of luck is incompatible thus. For example, all empirical knowledge involves the world "cooperating" with the agent, and to that extent involves a kind of luck. So it cannot be that knowledge is incompatible with lucksimpliciter. What kind of luck is incompatible with knowledge, then? Surely, if there is any point to conceptual analysis, it has to be to address questions like this one. And had McGinn engaged the recent epistemological literature on this question, and furthermore had been able to provide a novel and plausible answer, some optimism might have been called for. In the absence of such an answer, however, we are back where we started: with a sprawl of candidate analyses, none of which has attained widespread acceptance -- and a distinct fear that this predicament might just be the symptom of a misguided method.

But let us assume for the sake of argument that philosophers have a realistic shot at providing necessary and sufficient conditions for several philosophically interesting concepts. Does it follow that conceptual analysis is a worthwhile endeavor? That depends, in part, on what analyzing concepts gets us. Hilary Kornblith (2002) and Edward Craig (1999) have argued that it does not get us much of philosophical interest (although for different reasons). McGinn would not agree, but since he discusses neither Kornblith nor Craig it is hard to know on exactly what basis. At any rate, McGinn takes it that conceptual analysis gives us an insight into the essences of things. In other words, the conceptual analyst analyzes concepts because better understanding our concepts makes us understand the essences they refer to. How so? Because "there is no divide between concept and thing: the concept is individuated by the property -- its content consists in its reference" (65). Consequently, "There is thus no such thing as analyzing a concept that is not analyzing the property it denotes: to analyze a concept is to analyze the property that gives it content" (ibid.). Let us refer to this idea as the No Divide Thesis.

The No Divide Thesis provides a tentative answer to the question why conceptual analysis is worthwhile: it gives us insight into the essences picked out by our concepts. The answer is tentative, however, because the extent to which we should be engaged in conceptual analysis also depends on whether conceptual analysis provides the bestway to uncover such essences. McGinn seems to assume that it does, but does not provide much in the way of warrant for this assumption. According to McGinn, a philosopher engaged in conceptual analysis "consults his 'intuitions' about possible states of affairs, his ways of classifying different objects" (71). In so doing, he is exercising a certain "recognitional capacity" (60, fn. 10), grounded in a "pre-definitional, non-linguistic, tacit" (57) knowledge of the referent's essence. In other words, the conceptual analyst seeks to uncover a conceptual and, hence, psychological structure, for the purpose of getting at the corresponding essences. But should we really be doing psychology from the armchair? If we are serious about studying our concepts, should we not outsource the relevant study to psychologists working on human categorization?

McGinn might object that outsourcing the study of concepts thus would be to no longer be doing philosophy. Philosophy, he writes, "seeks the discovery of essences by a priori means alone -- not by experiment or observation or experience. It operates 'from the armchair': that is, by unaided (usually solitary) contemplation" (4). Indeed, McGinn goes so far as to suggest that "experimental philosophy" is an oxymoron (104). This, however, does not answer our question; if anything, it raises the further question "Why do philosophy, then?" Nor could McGinn object by saying that an empirical inquiry into our concepts would simply bring "extraneous knowledge" (68), as opposed to knowledge of essences. That might have been true if we had in mind an empirical inquiry into the external things instantiating our concepts, since such an inquiry might reveal merely contingent properties. But that is not what psychologists working on human categorization are studying; just like the conceptual analyst, they are studying our concepts, and if the No Divide Thesis holds, this is ipso facto to study the relevant essences.

At times, McGinn seems to acknowledge this point. For example, he writes that "there is nothing to stop the analyst from enlisting empirical methods of conceptual exploration" (132). But this concession is far more significant than he seems aware of. You do not need to be a naturalist to believe that, if something can be investigated by experimental means, it should be investigated thus (assuming that it should be investigated at all), on account of the significant epistemic merits of experimental science. It would have been better for McGinn to simply deny that the antecedent is satisfied within philosophy. Indeed, in a footnote, McGinn seems to do exactly that, when suggesting that "there are no experiments that could be devised to discover whether the will is free, skepticism is answerable, the mind is the body, and so on. The most that could be expected would be empirical investigations of what people think when they use certain concepts" (133, fn. 7). But his commitment to the No Divide Thesis seems to imply otherwise. Again, if to study our concepts -- be it of free will, knowledge, mind, or body -- is ipso facto to study essences, then someone investigating our concepts empirically is no less in the business of uncovering essences than is the conceptual analyst.

While certainly no friend of experimental philosophy -- the meta-philosophy that he rejects in a footnote as "consisting mainly of slogans and tendentious philosophical history" (127, fn. 1) -- McGinn might at this point attempt a truce with the experimentalist. More specifically, he might suggest that, while it is possible to uncover essences by experimental means, we have no reason to believe that the armchair provides a worse way of doing so. This seems to be his strategy when addressing research on cross-cultural and gender differences in intuitions, and on the susceptibility of intuitive judgments to be influenced by irrelevant factors (such as order of presentation):

the vagaries of surveys about people's conceptual intuitions should not make one rush to abandon the whole idea that people have clear convictions about the proper application of their concepts and that there is strong underlying convergence. To entitle oneself to that negative claim, one would need to show that all other variables had been controlled for -- a formidable task, and not one that has to my knowledge been accomplished (133).

Two things about this. First, why is the default assumption that there are no inter-personal differences or biasing influences, and that conceptual analysis should be conducted from the armchair, unless experimentalists can perform the "formidable task" of conclusively defeating that assumption? It would seem more reasonable to take the onus to be on the conceptual analyst to show that this assumption is warranted, given her significant investment in such analysis. Second, notice that this point remains even if further experimental research shows that there are no inter-personal differences (e.g., Nagel et al., in prep.), or that certain variations in intuitive judgments are mere artifacts of pragmatic cues (e.g., Cullen 2010). If previous experiments stand in need of correction, this merely goes to show that our attempts at teasing out the contents of our concepts might generate misleading results unless we take great methodological care. In fact, even if all studies on philosophical intuitions to date have been methodologically flawed, that is no argument for sticking with the armchair; if anything, it is an argument for doing more (and better) experimental philosophy.

At the end of the day, it might turn out that probing our intuitions from the armchair provides a perfectly appropriate epistemic pathway to our concepts -- but that is a straightforwardly empirical hypothesis that the conceptual analyst cannot simply assume is warranted. Had McGinn engaged with this hypothesis in a systematic manner -- e.g., along the lines of such defenders of the evidential value of intuitions as Joel Pust (2000), Alvin Goldman (2007), and Jennifer Nagel (forthcoming) -- his book might have been a valuable contribution to current meta-philosophical debates. Instead, McGinn's oversights with respect to significant parts of the relevant philosophical and empirical literature, on this topic just like on the ones highlighted in the above, make his book unlikely to advance current discussions on the problems and prospects of conceptual analysis.[2]

Works Cited

Craig, E. (1999). Knowledge and the State of Nature, Oxford University Press.

Cullen, S. (2010). "Survey-driven Romanticism," Review of Philosophy and Psychology 1: 275-296.

Goldman, A. (1992). "Epistemic Folkways and Scientific Epistemology," in his Liaisons: Philosophy Meets the Cognitive and Social Sciences, The MIT Press, pp. 155-175.

Goldman, A. (2007). "Philosophical Intuitions: Their Target, Their Source, and Their Epistemic Status," Grazer Philosophische Studien 74: 1-26.

Jackson, F. (1998). From Metaphysics to Ethics: A Defence of Conceptual Analysis, Oxford University Press.

Kornblith, H. (2002). Knowledge and its Place in Nature, Oxford University Press.

Murphy, G. L. (2002). The Big Book of Concepts, The MIT Press.

Nagel, J. (forthcoming). "Intuitions and Experiments: A Defence of the Case Method in Epistemology," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.

Nagel, J., San Juan, V., and Mar, R. (in prep.). "Gettier Case Recognition."

Pritchard, D. (2005). Epistemic Luck, Oxford University Press.

Pust, J. (2000). Intuitions as Evidence. Garland Publishing Inc.

Ramsey, W. (1998). "Prototypes and Conceptual Analysis," in M. R. DePaul and W. Ramsey (Eds.), Rethinking Intuition: The Psychology of Intuition and Its Role in Philosophical Inquiry, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, pp. 161-178.

Rosch, E. and Mervis, C. (1975). "Family Resemblances: Studies in the Internal Structure of Categories," Cognitive Psychology 7: 573-605.

Suits, B. (1978). The Grasshopper: Games, Life and Utopia, University of Toronto Press.

[1] See Rosch and Mervis (1975) for a classic study, and Murphy (2002) for an overview.

[2] Thanks to Hilary Kornblith and James Beebe for helpful comments on an earlier draft.