Truth in Husserl, Heidegger, and the Frankfurt School: Critical Retrieval

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Lambert Zuidervaart, Truth in Husserl, Heidegger, and the Frankfurt School: Critical Retrieval, MIT Press, 2017, 256 pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262036283.

Reviewed by Patrick Murray, Creighton University


Lambert Zuidervaart delivers a clear, compact, and analytically ordered book with an engaging narrative spine. What can some key twentieth-century German philosophers teach us about how best to conceive of truth? It is a rewarding read. Much of the material has appeared previously, but it benefits from the book’s aiming for a comprehensive conception of truth. Zuidervaart’s previous books set the context, as do two more in progress, a companion volume on analytic theories of truth and a culminating work: " “Articulating the details of such a comprehensive conception of truth is the ultimate aim of my decades-long research project” (ix). Going against the current, Zuidervaart has passionately explored nonpropositional truth since his graduate studies. It is no wonder that he is struck by Daniel Dahlstrom’s identification, in Heidegger’s Concept of Truth, of a “logical prejudice” in much of Western philosophy. That prejudice is Zuidervaart’s target: there is much more to truth than propositions.

Zuidervaart calls his project “critical retrieval.” “Critical retrieval” is not rummaging through the philosophical scrapyard. The possibilities for philosophical thinking are intimately related to our heritage. Any new conception, he observes, “must emerge from the interplay among different traditions and positions” (7-8). In Interpreting Modern Philosophy, James Collins criticizes P. F. Strawson for making a “purist split” between the history of philosophy and philosophy: the two pursuits do not split apart. Zuidervaart’s “critical retrieval” goes beyond that broad observation: “My model is neither commentary nor historiography but rather a text-based immanent critique”; it is “a combination, often precarious, of dependence upon, and transcendence of, the object of criticism” (11). Critical retrieval is a creative bootstrapping operation.

Five German philosophers are the focus of this study: Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, Theodor W. Adorno, Max Horkheimer, and Jürgen Habermas. Key texts for this study are Husserl’s Logical Investigations, Heidegger’s Being and Time and “On the Essence of Truth,” Adorno’s Negative Dialectic, Horkheimer’s “On the Problem of Truth,” and Habermas’s Truth and Justification. If some of the matchups seem incongruous, Zuidervaart begs to differ and reminds us of a common source: “Critical theory and Heideggerian thinking are the conflicted offspring of Husserlian phenomenology” (147). Zuidervaart’s choice of philosophers announces his intention to put German phenomenologists and critical theorists in dialogue. A wider conversation is going on in the background: “I also begin to explore how insights critically retrieved from German continental philosophy can help one address contemporary debates in analytic truth theory” (1).

The dominant conception of truth as propositional truth is too restrictive, Zuidervaart believes. He seeks a more comprehensive, existential conception “that neither reduces truth to propositional matters nor dismisses the importance of propositional truth” (ix). The conception that Zuidervaart proposes resists a phenomenologically uncritical analytical tendency to treat aspects of a complex whole, notably, propositional truth, as independent factors. In that respect, Heidegger’s Being and Time, with its phenomenological exposition of equiprimordial “existentials” of Dasein, is of fundamental importance. Though Zuidervaart goes on to sharply criticize the conception of authenticity on which Heidegger relies to authenticate truth, Heidegger’s encompassing conception of truth as “disclosure” is the gravitational center of Zuidervaart’s critical retrieval. Nonpropositional and propositional truth are two aspects of that “disclosure.”

Zuidervaart organizes this book around three topics:

One is the distinction and relation between propositional truth and truth that is ‘more than’ propositional (what I call existential truth) . . . A second issue concerns the relation between propositional truth and the discursive justification of propositional truth claims, as framed in analytic philosophy by debates between epistemic and nonepistemic conceptions of truth. The third issue pertains to the relation between propositional truth and the objectivity of knowledge, often presented in analytic philosophy as a conflict between realists and antirealists. (p. 2)

He does not come down on one side or the other of these three bifurcations; rather, his goal is to reframe the philosophy of truth to eliminate them.

Zuidervaart’s aspiration for the trio of books of which this is the first is no less than to transform philosophy: “No longer restricting the ranges of experience that can authenticate the truth of its conceptual reflection, philosophy itself would be transformed” (101). In fact, Zuidervaart is thick into transforming philosophy as he works out his comprehensive theory of truth. Though Donald Davidson does not get much attention here, the philosophical transformation that Zuidervaart is undertaking seems to fit what Davidson calls “the new anti-subjectivism” and what Frank Farrell, drawing on Davidson, Hegel, and Heidegger, describes as “the recovery of the world.” But Zuidervaart seeks more than to recover the world; he looks to this philosophical renewal to change the world: “the transformation of philosophy is significant for cultural and societal change” (16).

Truth is an existential concern. But, in place of Heidegger’s “notion of disclosedness, as an ontological state of essential openness,” Zuidervaart offers:

the notion of life-giving disclosure, as a historical process of opening up society. By ‘life-giving’ I mean a process in which human beings and other creatures come to flourish, and not just some human beings or certain creatures, but all of them in their interconnections. (70)

In place of Heidegger’s call to authenticity, which Zuidervaart finds disappointingly asocial and empty, he sees humans as called to witness to truth:

To bear witness to the truth means to do what truth requires in a social context and with respect to others who co-inhabit that context. Bearing witness involves the full range of human activities, not only linguistic and discursive but also aesthetic, ethical, political, economic, and the like. (98)

In Chapters 2 and 6, Zuidervaart digs into Husserl’s early theory of truth, as found in his Logical Investigations. Husserl introduces four concepts of truth, each of which involves intentional objects: objective identity, evidence (or inter-active coincidence), the fullness of the intuited object, and the correctness of the signitive intention with respect to the object identified. Zuidervaart calls the first and third, object functions, and the second and fourth, subject functions. He writes, “Husserl’s four-dimensional conception of truth is expansive enough to anchor propositional correctness in a broader truth, to highlight the intentional character of knowledge and . . . to emphasize object-sided truth” (34). Zuidervaart is drawn to Husserl, then, because his concepts of truth emphasize intentionality and objectivity and they involve both propositional and nonpropositional knowledge, pointing toward a comprehensive conception of truth.

Zuidervaart faults Husserl for his narrowly individualistic conception of subjectivity: “Husserl’s transcendental subjectivity is an I and not a we” (41). So, the early Husserl fails to pay attention to the ways that knowing is mediated by society and history, and to practices involved in political interactions, economic transactions, and ethical relations. True to his comprehensive conception, Zuidervaart insists that the identification of practical objects involves a “dynamic coherence” between diverse nonpropositional practices and those overtly involving language and logic.

Zuidervaart advances two key concepts, predicative availability and predicative self-disclosure. Predicative availability is one of multiple ways that things make themselves available to us. In this mode, things “offer themselves to us in a way that lets us make assertions about them. We do not impose such availability upon them, nor does our assertoric practice alone create their identity” (61). Predication, then, is not mere subjective construction; it is not the one-sided imposition of purely subjective categories. Zuidervaart’s notion of the “dynamic coherence” of predicative self-disclosure as “a process whereby an entity, in its predicative availability, offers or manifests itself in relevant accord with nonpredicative aspects of its availability” (63) is meant to ensure that predicative availability is neither wishful thinking nor the tautology that things must be predicatively available because we make predications of them. Patterns of nonpredicative availability that accord with predications show that things are disclosing themselves to us. These key concepts thrust us into thorny metaphysical and epistemological territory. Does predicative availability presuppose a metaphysics of form?

In Chapter 3, “Truth as Disclosure,” Zuidervaart examines disclosure in Heidegger’s Being and Time. Truth as disclosure figures centrally in Zuidervaart’s own comprehensive conception of truth, especially the nonpropositional disclosure that Heidegger calls “handiness”: “If entities did not disclose themselves in nonpredicative ways for nonassertoric practices, most of them would be incapable of predicative self-disclosure. This is an indispensable insight to be retained from Heidegger’s account of handiness” (65).

Assertion is an important form of disclosure for Zuidervaart because “propositional truth is indispensable to life-giving disclosure” (71). He criticizes Heidegger for demoting assertion to a derivative mode of interpretation. Heidegger describes assertion as the “‘leveling down of the primordial’” (59). Zuidervaart is not happy with that talk; he counters, “the transition from interpretation to assertion need not involve a leveling or dwindling . . . but a leap” (59). Far from distorting, proper predication makes “nonpredicative availability more broadly and precisely accessible” (61). Heidegger underplays assertion in that he “does not emphasize sufficiently that the hermeneutical fore-structure on which asserting draws is itself shaped in part by the predications already available” (58). Perhaps, but I wonder if Zuidervaart underplays Heidegger’s own statement that assertion is an equiprimordial existential of Dasein.

Zuidervaart begins Chapter 4 “Authenticating Truth: Heidegger and Adorno in Reverse,” with the observation that Heidegger and Adorno hold similar views as to how truth is authenticated: “Whereas Martin Heidegger says this occurs in the ‘authenticity’ of Dasein, Theodor Adorno locates the authentication of truth in ‘emphatic experience’” (77). Zuidervaart is sharply critical of both strategies. He identifies three problems with Heidegger’s account of authenticity:

First, it turns a substantial concept pertaining to actual merits into a formal state of being self-related. Second, it transfigures a historically conditioned and destructive rupture in the fabric of modern society (i.e. ‘alienation’) into an ontological and authenticating encounter with one’s own finitude. Third, it turns a mediated process of disclosure into a denial of mediation. (82)

Reduced to nonconformism, an abstract negation of the “they-self,” authenticity strangely turns sociality into a straight-jacket from which Dasein must be freed, but without direction as to what it is freed for. Heidegger’s “call to conscience” lacks content. Mediation is scuttled, leaving no public means to authenticate truth. Zuidervaart concludes, “Because of the pivotal role ‘authenticity’ plays in Heidegger’s general conception, his idea of truth becomes internally untenable” (90).

In Adorno’s negative dialectic, the riddle of knowing is “to conceptualize the nonconceptual without subsuming the nonconceptual under a system of concepts” (91). Adorno’s apprehensions recall Heidegger’s over assertions “leveling” experience. Zuidervaart employs the phrase “predicative availability” to insist that practical objects “let us refer to them with specificity in language”; we need not impose our constructions on them. How far might this idea go in allaying Adorno’s fears? Not far enough, I suspect. Adorno was attracted to the image of predication as tracing a constellation. This image suits “predicative availability” in as much as the stars do “let us refer to them with specificity in language,” but will it fit “predicative self-disclosure”? Do Orion’s stars disclose themselves as a hunter?

To solve the riddle, Adorno turns to “emphatic experience,” which is “something the subject undergoes in relation to a particular object in its nonconceptualized particularity. Emphatic experience is characterized by novelty and by the object’s directing the subject’s response” (91). But capitalist social practices make money the great leveler. Living in a capitalist society makes “emphatic experience” a rarity and its occurrence unpredictable. The problem that faces Adorno is that this condition disqualifies almost everyone from the process of authenticating truth. But Zuidervaart insists: “Truth calls for public authentication. It calls for democratic truth-telling, both verbal and nonverbal, that does not avoid public presentation and response” (100). Consequently, Adorno’s conception of truth is untenable.

In Chapter 5, “Truth and Justification: Jürgen Habermas,” Zuidervaart tracks the trajectory of Habermas’s thinking from antirealist to quasi-realist. He distinguishes three stages: “consensus theory,” “formal pragmatics,” and “pragmatic realism.” Habermas ends up a kind of realist with respect to truth, rejecting his earlier reduction of truth to justified assertibility, and antirealist with respect to justification. Zuidervaart finds Habermas’s conception of truth untenable, as key questions are left unanswered. (1) How does experience make propositions true? (2) Argumentation may make propositions acceptable, but does it establish their truth? (3) What about practical objects allows us to form reliable beliefs about them? (4) What about practical objects allows us to make truth claims about them? (5) Does discursive justification authenticate truth? Habermas’s silences won’t do, since the point of discursive argumentation is to authenticate truth.

Chapter 7 examines Heidegger’s “On the Essence of Truth” and Horkheimer’s “On the Problem of Truth.” The two philosophers make freedom and history integral to truth, in different ways, but Zuidervaart finds neither acceptable. Heidegger argues that the essence of truth is freedom, the freedom to let beings be. But Western science and technology increasingly flatten “the openedness of beings as a whole” and stifle the freedom that truth requires. We are left to engage in “the thinking of Being” and await a new historical dispensation.

Horkheimer approaches truth from a philosophy of materialist dialectics. For Horkheimer, Zuidervaart writes, “truth is practical, not just theoretical, and the process whereby we attain truth . . . includes ‘real historical will and action’” (160). Zuidervaart is sympathetic to Horkheimer’s incorporation of political action in history into his conception of truth, but he finds fault with Horkheimer’s overconfidence in the power of critical theory to guide action and with his failure to articulate a vision of human flourishing.

The comprehensive conception of truth retrieved by Zuidervaart in this study is well stated by the author:

Truth, then, in its most comprehensive sense, is not simply a propositional matter. But neither is it a mysterious fate beyond our control. Truth is a historical process that unfolds as a dynamic correlation between human fidelity to societal principles, on the one hand, and a life-giving disclosure of society, on the other. Moreover, these correlates are indissoluble: creaturely flourishing is the point of human fidelity to societal principles, and such fidelity is a prerequisite for society disclosure. (173)

We can look forward to Zuidervaart’s developing this expansive, existential conception of truth in the two books to come.


Collins, James. Interpreting Modern Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 1972.

Dahlstrom, Daniel. Heidegger’s Concept of Truth. Cambridge University Press, 2001.

Davidson, Donald. Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective. Clarendon Press, 2001.

Farrell, Frank B., Subjectivity, Realism and Postmodernism: The Recovery of the World in Recent Philosophy. CCambridge University Press, 1996.

Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. Joan Stambaugh, trans. Dennis J. Schmidt, revised trans., State University of New York Press, 2010.