Truth in Virtue of Meaning: A Defence of the Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

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Gillian Russell, Truth in Virtue of Meaning: A Defence of the Analytic/Synthetic Distinction, Oxford University Press, 2008, 232pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199232192.

Reviewed by Åsa Wikforss, Stockholm University


In her new book Gillian Russell puts forth a novel defense of the analytic-synthetic distinction. During the first couple of decades following Quine's "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" (1951) analyticity fell into disrepute. Once Kripke allowed us to separate analyticity from necessity the case appeared closed: With Kripke's help it seemed as if we could get all the modal results we wanted without having to fall back on the idea that there are certain truths that are 'true in virtue of meaning alone'. More recently, however, analyticity has undergone something of a renaissance. In particular, it has been suggested that although Quine was right to question the idea that there are truths that are true in virtue of meaning, he was wrong to give up the idea that there are certain truths that have special epistemic properties, i.e. that can be known a priori (Boghossian 1996). In her defense of analyticity Russell takes the opposite line: She suggests that Quine was right to give up the idea that there are analytic truths in the sense of being a priori knowable, but wrong to reject the idea that certain truths are true in virtue of meaning.

Russell's book is impressive and richly argued. It has a central thesis that we need to bring the debate on analyticity up to date and leave behind the simpler conception of meaning that underlies the traditional construals of the analytic-synthetic distinction. Contemporary philosophy of language has made clear that there are several distinct notions of meaning, playing different roles, and once we separate these, we can get a clearer grip on analyticity and see our way through to the idea that certain truths are, precisely, true in virtue of meaning. These truths may not have all the epistemic properties traditionally ascribed to analyticity, Russell argues, but they do nonetheless play a special role in the justification of belief.

The book is divided into three main parts. In the first, Russell sets out to defend her alternative conception of analyticity (including an appendix that formalizes the account). In the second part, she examines some central objections to the analytic-synthetic distinction. And in the final part, which is acknowledged to be more sketchy, she discusses possible epistemological implications of her view. I begin by presenting the three parts in order. I then discuss whether, indeed, Russell's novel strategy for resurrecting truths in virtue of meaning is successful. Since Part I contains Russell's own proposal, and takes up more than half of the book, my focus will be on it.

I. The Positive View

The book takes off from Boghossian's claim that we cannot make sense of the idea that certain truths are true in virtue of meaning alone. All truths depend on the world being a certain way, Boghossian argues, even such trivial truths as 'Copper is copper'. Russell agrees that we should reject the idea that the meaning of a sentence is entirely responsible for its truth value. The meaning of 'All bachelors are unmarried' does not make it the case that all bachelors are unmarried. However, she suggests, there is another sense in which a sentence may be true in virtue of meaning, one that does not have the absurd implication that the world plays no role at all in determining the truth value of the sentence. Russell considers Kaplan's 'I am here now'. In some sense, it would seem, the meaning of this sentence guarantees its truth -- and yet it is not this meaning that makes it the case that I am here now. Russell puts this by saying that the meaning of the sentence fully determines its truth value.

To illustrate the notion of 'full determination', Russell uses a mathematical example, the case where 0 takes the first argument place in the multiplication function x x y = z. It does not matter what number we put in the second argument place and in that sense the value of the function is fully determined by the first argument. Still, there is a sense in which the second argument determines the value as well, only 'redundantly' so. Similarly, Russell suggests, the truth-value of a sentence is determined by two factors: the meaning of the sentence and the way the world is. The truth value of an analytic sentence is fully determined by the meaning of the sentence, whereas the value of a synthetic sentence is not. An analytic sentence, thus, is one that is true no matter how the 'world-factor' is varied (32-37).

As Russell immediately notes, this raises the threat that analyticity collapses into necessity: necessary truths are precisely those that are true in all possible worlds, independently of how the world-factor varies. Such a collapse would be unfortunate since we do not want 'Hesperus is Phosphorus', or 'Water is H2O', to be classified among the analytic truths. Russell also worries that unless analyticity can be divorced from necessity we will fail to capture some sentences that should be characterized as true in virtue of meaning, but which do not express necessary truths (such as 'I am here now') (39-40). How can this be remedied?

At this point Russell reaches for some contemporary semantic distinctions. She suggests that a certain pre-theoretic but mistaken picture of meaning, what she calls 'the language myth', has obscured the debate over analyticity. According to the myth, meaning has a three-fold function: it captures speaker understanding, it contributes to what the sentence as a whole says, and it determines which objects the expression applies to (44). Russell argues that work within philosophy of language over the last few decades, starting with Kripke, Putnam and Kaplan in the 1970's, has shown that there is no notion of meaning that fulfills these three functions. For instance, Kripke argued that although descriptions may serve to fix the reference of a name (or the extension of a natural kind term) this does not imply that they are part of the meaning of the term, or provide synonyms. Similarly, Kaplan has shown that in the case of indexicals and demonstratives we need to distinguish between the meaning or character expressed, and the contribution made to the proposition or content expressed. The character of 'I', for instance, does not serve as a component of the content of 'I am hungry'; rather, it provides a rule that determines the referent, and hence the content, expressed. Russell therefore suggests that the language myth should be replaced with a more sophisticated picture of meaning, according to which 'meaning' is multiply ambiguous. She proposes that we distinguish between four different notions of meaning (46):

(i) character: the thing speakers must know to count as understanding an expression

(ii) content: what a word contributes to the proposition expressed

(iii) reference determiner: a condition which an object must meet in order to be the referent of, or fall in the extension of, an expression

(iv) referent/extension: the (set of) object(s) to which the term applies

With these distinctions in hand, Russell argues, we can develop a new way of understanding truth in virtue of meaning. Russell proposes two important revisions of the traditional picture: First, the relevant notion of meaning is that of (iii) (and (i), in the case of indexicals and demonstratives). Truth in virtue of meaning, she argues, is truth in virtue of reference determiner. Second, the role of the world is more complex than recognized by the traditional two-factor picture according to which the truth value of a sentence is a function of the meaning of the terms and of how the world is. In addition to the context of evaluation, ce, she suggests, we have to appeal to the role of the context of utterance, cu (in the case of indexicals and demonstratives), and to the context of introduction, ci (in the case of names and natural kind terms). For instance, Russell argues, 'Hesperus' refers to Hesperus as a result of two things: the reference determiner for 'Hesperus', the bright speck on the horizon in the morning on such and such a day, and the context of introduction. If the context of introduction had been different, the reference determiner would have picked out another planet (Mars, for instance, if Mars had been the bright speck on the horizon, etc.). And if 'Hesperus' had had a different reference determiner (for instance, the red planet) then Hesperus would refer to Mars, even if the context of introduction were the same (54). The same story, Russell argues, can be told for natural kind terms, such as 'water', which are directly referential: 'Water' refers to water as a result of the reference determiner of 'water', the substance that has the same underlying structure as that stuff, taken together with the context of introduction. In the case of ordinary predicates such as 'bachelor', by contrast, the relevant context is simply the context of evaluation. These predicates, Russell suggests, are fully descriptive in the sense that their reference determiners are not sensitive to the context of utterance or the context of introduction. Thus, the referent of such a predicate is fully determined by the reference determiner (59).

Russell's proposal is therefore that the truth value V of a sentence is a function M' of the reference determiner R and the three contexts: ⟨ci, cu, ce, R, V⟩. A sentence is true in virtue of meaning, if the value true is fully determined by the meaning (i.e. reference determiners) of the relevant terms, independently of how the world factors are varied. Following Kaplan, Russell also adds that contexts of utterance contain their own contexts of evaluation such that the agent is always located at the place and time of the utterance in the context of evaluation, thereby replacing M' with M*: ⟨ci, cu, R, V⟩. This ensures that although the content expressed by 'I am here now' is contingent, it cannot be uttered to express a falsehood and in that sense the sentence is true in virtue of meaning. This leads Russell to propose the following modal definition of truth in virtue of meaning:

A sentence is true in virtue of meaning just in case for all pairs of context of introduction and context of utterance, the proposition expressed by S with respect to those contexts is true in the context of evaluation (56).

Equipped with this definition, Russell is able to explain why 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' and 'Water is H2O' are not analytic truths. Although the truth of 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' is fully determined by the reference determiners of 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' taken together with the context of introduction, varying the context of introduction will vary the truth-value of the sentence. Hence, 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' is not true in virtue of meaning (i.e. reference determiner). Similarly, in the case of natural kind terms. Since the relevant reference determiner is context sensitive, varying the context of introduction of 'water' will affect the truth value of 'Water is H2O' (for instance, if the context of introduction were Twin Earth). Consequently, 'Water is H2O' is not an analytic truth.

However, Russell worries that this notion of analyticity also is too permissive since it seems to follow that certain sentences that intuitively express synthetic truths will come out as true in virtue of meaning -- i.e. those that express necessary truths as a matter of substantive modal fact (for instance, there is a god). To avoid this consequence, Russell argues that we must distinguish analyticity in the above-mentioned modal sense from a stricter, more metaphysical conception of truth in virtue of meaning. This stricter notion draws on the relations among the relevant reference determiners. Reference determiners provide conditions of correct applications for terms, Russell argues, and we can therefore consider three types of relations among reference determiners: identity, containment, and exclusion. Thus, 'Hesperus is Hesperus' is true in virtue of meaning because the relation between the reference determiners is one of identity. When this is the case, the terms are strictly synonymous. In other cases the relation is one of containment. For instance, if 'Mohammed Ali' is introduced to refer to whatever object 'Cassius Clay' refers to, then the reference determiner for 'Mohammed Ali' contains the reference determiners for 'Cassius Clay', and the sentence 'Mohammed Ali is Cassius Clay' will be true in virtue of meaning (82-83). And in the case of 'No bachelors are married' we need to appeal to the idea that the relation of exclusion holds between the reference determiners of the predicates 'bachelor' and 'married'.

II: The Defense

In the second part of the book Russell defends her account of analyticity against a variety of possible objections. She starts out by examining Quine's well-known objections, arguing that her account of analyticity fares substantially better than the traditional, positivist account that was his target. For instance, she argues that her appeal to reference determiners does not fall prey to Quine's 'circularity objection', the claim that any definition of analyticity in terms of synonymy or necessity will be viciously circular. Although her appeal to reference determiners would not have passed Quine's more restrictive, dispositional approach to meaning, Russell argues, the notion of a reference determiner does not presuppose those of analyticity, synonymy or necessity (133-135).

Russell also discusses Quine's remarks on the transient quality of definitions, the fact that although a term may have been introduced by a stipulative definition, the definition may later be forgotten or revised without a change in meaning of the term (143-162). To understand Quine's remarks, Russell suggests, we should construe them as being concerned with a particular species of definitions, i.e. reference-fixing definitions for names and natural kind terms. For instance, 'acid' may have been introduced via a definition such as substance that turns litmus paper red but the function of this definition was not to give a synonym of 'acid' but merely to fix the referent of 'acid' as a sample of the substance that turns litmus paper red (in the context of introduction). So there is a sense in which Quine was quite right to suggest that definitions are transient or ephemeral. However, Russell argues, it does not follow that analyticity can be transient or ephemeral since analytic sentences are true in all contexts of utterance and introduction. Rather, the lesson to be learned is that reference-fixing sentences are never analytic and that only a restricted class of definitions is transient -- those that fix the reference of names and natural kind terms (154-157).

One chapter is spent on addressing a variety of other objections to the analytic-synthetic distinction. For instance, Russell discusses the obstacles posed by semantic externalism to traditional construals of analyticity (175-184). The externalist idea that meaning is determined by the environment entails a separation of meaning and speaker knowledge, as well as a separation of meaning and reference determiner, and this may seem to undermine the idea that there are truths in virtue of meaning. Russell concedes that this picture does damage to the idea that truths of meaning have certain epistemological properties. However, she denies that externalism poses any threat to her account of analyticity. It is wrong, she argues, to think that a sentence the content of which varies with the environment cannot be analytic. For instance, 'I am here now' has a content that varies with the environment and yet it is, according to Russell, an analytic truth. The mistake is the assumption that it is the content of an analytic sentence that makes it analytic, whereas it is the reference determiners that make it analytic. Similarly, Russell argues, with respect to much-discussed examples such as Cats are animals, Gold is a yellow metal, All men are rational animals, Tigers have four legs. The externalist is quite right to deny that these are analytic truths. However, the reason they are not analytic truths is not that their content is determined externalistically, but that their truth-value is not fully determined by the relevant reference determiners.

III: The Epistemological Consequences

The last part of Russell's book is devoted to discussing the epistemological consequences of her construal of analyticity. Russell argues that although there is not much solace to be had when it comes to a priority, her account nonetheless shows that there is a distinctive form of justification provided by analytic sentences, what she calls analytic justification. Since analytic truths are truths in virtue of reference determiners, and reference determiners concern the necessary conditions for applying a term, I can come to know such a truth simply by reflecting on these conditions. This is not always something that can be done a priori, since we may not know the relevant reference determiners a priori, but it is nonetheless a distinctive form of reflection since it does not requires regular investigations of the world. For instance, I can come to know the truth of All bachelors are men simply by reflecting on the relation between the reference determiners of bachelor and men, whereas finding out the truth of All bachelors are frustrated requires studies of actual bachelors (198-199).

Russell also discusses the relation between analytic justification and semantic competence. Traditionally, of course, analytic truths were supposed to be such that being a competent speaker sufficed for knowing their truth. On Russell's view, by contrast, analyticity is separated from semantic competence since, she argues, semantic competence with a term does not require knowing its reference determiners. According to her, what is epistemically interesting about analytic sentences is not that all competent speakers will know their truth but, again, that one can come to know the truth of such a sentence if one knows the relevant reference determiners and their relations.

IV: Discussion

As should be clear from the above, this is a book full of creative suggestions and original ideas. Russell does us a great service by bringing the discussion of analyticity up to date, applying the contemporary tools of philosophy of language to the debate, and she presents an entirely new way of thinking about analyticity. Moreover, there is a commendable level of precision (something that is necessary given the relative complexity of the issues) combined with a deep knowledge of the field.

The interesting question, of course, is whether the positive proposal works. Does Russell succeed in reinstating an interesting notion of analyticity? No doubt, it is a rather unorthodox notion of analyticity that we are presented with -- one that severs the connection both with necessity and the a priori. But Russell's account would still be of considerable interest if it provides us with a tenable notion of truth in virtue of meaning.

The key to Russell's account, it is clear, lies in the idea that truth in virtue of meaning is truth in virtue of reference determiners. However, there is some difficulty as to how we are to understand the notion of a reference determiner. Russell, again, appeals to Kaplan's notion of character and its reference-fixing role, but also to the idea, derived from Kripke, that in the case of names and natural kind terms associated descriptions serve to fix the referent even though they are not in any way part of the meaning of the terms. The most natural (and common) way of understanding Kripke's talk of reference fixing descriptions, is as a claim within metasemantics or foundational semantics -- i.e. as a claim about what makes it the case that a term has a certain meaning and reference (extension) in the first place. For instance, it is said, an associated description such as the wet, transparent, thirst-quenching stuff around here serves the metasemantic role of determining the meaning of 'water', without being part of its meaning. The descriptivists, on this view, have simply mistaken that which belongs to metasemantics with what belongs with semantics proper.

Russell also suggests that reference determiners in the case of names and natural kind terms belong to metasemantics. In this respect, she says, they differ from the reference determiners of indexicals and demonstratives (i.e. from character) since these do belong to meaning and, indeed, are such that they are known by competent speakers. Reference determiners, she says, are not always meanings:

The reference determiner for a name, for example, is no part of the meaning of a name … Rather the reference determiner belongs to what Kaplan calls metasemantics. Facts about reference determiners are facts about how the meanings of words get fixed, not meaning ascriptions themselves. (66-67)

This, again, is a natural construal of Kripke's claims about fixing descriptions, and it fits well with Russell's appeal to the 'context of introduction'. However, if Russell's reference determiners indeed belonged to metasemantics, they could not do the work she wants them to do.

Russell, recall, characterizes reference determiners as "a condition which an object must meet in order to be the referent of, or fall in the extension of, an expression" (46). This allows her to argue that reference determiners stand in the relations of identity, containment and exclusion, which is the basis for her account of strict synonymy and analyticity (as well as that of analytic justification). However, if reference determiners belong to metasemantics, then reference determiners cannot be conditions of correct application. Metasemantics concerns the facts that serve to determine conditions of correct applications. It is of course a very controversial question what these metasemantic facts are (facts about individual use, or about causal relations, or conceptual roles, etc.). But whatever story one favors, metasemantic facts are not conditions for correct application but determinants of such conditions. Hence, if reference determiners belong to metasemantics they cannot be employed to show that there are truths in virtue of meaning.

No doubt, the talk of 'determination' is potentially confusing since, traditionally, meaning is said to determine conditions for correct application as well. But a moment's reflection reveals that there are two determination relations at play here: First, the metasemantic one, according to which certain facts serve to determine the meaning (and reference) of an expression. Second, the semantic one, according to which meaning determines reference and extension. The first relation is non-semantic (assuming even the most modest form of naturalism), telling us something about how semantic facts depend on nonsemantic ones. The second relation, by contrast, is fully semantic, relating meanings to referents and extensions. That there are two distinct relations involved can also be seen if we consider the direct reference picture according to which the meaning of a name is exhausted by its referent. If the meaning of a name is exhausted by its referent then there is nothing that serves the semantic role of determination. However, the metasemantic determination relation must of course be in place -- that is, there must be some facts in virtue of which the name gets to have a referent in the first place.

Thus, while Russell suggests that reference determiners in the case of names and natural kind terms belong to metasemantics, this cannot be right. Indeed, when we look to the actual account provided by Russell, it is clear that these reference determiners are part of semantics; after all, they are listed among the four notions of meaning, and serve as one of the factors in Russell's function M*. Let us therefore ignore Russell's comments about metasemantics and assume that Russell's reference determiners belong solidly with semantics. The difference between character and reference determiners, then, is merely epistemic: character is something known by competent speakers, whereas reference determiners are not. And the truly novel aspect of Russell's proposal is precisely the idea that we can construe Kripkean reference fixers not as belonging with metasemantics, but as going into the semantics itself, serving a function akin to that of Kaplanian character.

How plausible is this move? It will, no doubt, draw criticism from the direct reference camp. Although followers of Kripke are happy to grant the metasemantic role of descriptions, they will be hesitant to stick these descriptions into the semantics. Of course, Russell's story is still compatible with Kripke's anti-descriptivism since the descriptive reference determiners do not serve as a component of the content expressed. Still, those who oppose descriptivism may wonder what motivates the proposal that Kripke's reference fixing descriptions should go into the semantics in the first place. In the case of indexicals and demonstratives it seems well-motivated, since we do seem to need something like Kaplan's semantics to account for the special context sensitivity of these terms. In the case of names and natural kind terms, by contrast, it is far from clear that these are context sensitive. Indeed, the standard externalist line on natural kind terms (defended by Burge and Putnam) is precisely that these terms do not function like indexicals and that there is no meaning component that is stable across contexts of introduction (this is precisely why externalists hold that the meaning of 'water' is different on Twin Earth than on Earth).

But Russell's account is also likely to draw criticism from the Fregean camp. A possible motivation behind placing Kripke's reference fixing descriptions into the semantics would be to avoid the difficulties direct referentialists have in accounting for the cognitive perspective of the individual. Proponents of two-dimensionalism, for instance, have suggested that the reference fixing descriptions can be employed for this purpose and, indeed, can provide us with an account of a priori knowledge. But this, of course, is not a motivation that applies to Russell's account. She explicitly denies that the reference fixing descriptions are a priori available (which is plausible) and, moreover, she denies that they serve anything like the role of traditional concepts since they do not go into the content expressed. Although Russell's semantics, like two-dimensionalist semantics, involves double-indexing, Russell does not operate with two types of intensions or content. On her view, there is only one content -- the one fixed by the reference determiners in conjunction with the context of introduction. For those of us who worry about multiplying intensions, this is appealing. But it does mean that Russell's semantics cannot help with the original Fregean puzzle. For example, even if her account shows that 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' (or 'Water is H2O') is not true in virtue of meaning, it does not explain how a rational individual could coherently believe Hesperus is Hesperus while rejecting Hesperus is Phosphorus (or believe Water is water while rejecting Water is H2O). After all, on Russell's view, the propositions expressed are the same.

This points to another important difference between Russell's account of analyticity and the traditional account: Russell's account of truth in virtue of meaning is divorced from that of conceptual truth. This is part and parcel of her claim that we must distinguish between truth in virtue of meaning and truth in virtue of content. On her account, when determining whether a sentence expresses an analytic truth we are permitted to vary the content expressed. For example, it is said that 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' does not express an analytic truth since varying the context of introduction will vary the content expressed, and hence the truth value of the sentence. This, it should be clear, constitutes a rather radical departure from traditional accounts of analyticity and it cuts the link with conceptual truth. After all, considering whether a sentence expresses a conceptual truth requires holding the content expressed steady.

Of course, there will be a considerable overlap between Russell's analytic truths and those traditionally said to be conceptual truths. Indeed, when it comes to much-discussed examples such as 'All bachelors are unmarried men' and 'A vixen is a female fox', Russell's account does not depart from the traditional one. In these cases, where the relevant predicates are 'fully descriptive', reference determiners and content coincide. This means, in effect, that in these cases Russell's reference determiners are doing no real work and that the sentences in question will be true in virtue of content, just as with the traditional conceptual truths. It also means that anybody skeptical of the traditional talk of conceptual truth will have equal reason to be skeptical of Russell's account of these sentences.

Regardless of whether Russell succeeds in converting those skeptics, however, it is clear that she has brought the debate on analyticity to a new level. In her book she presents us with an alternative, well-developed and highly original way of thinking about truth in virtue of meaning, one that circumvents many of the difficulties that plague traditional analyticity. This makes the book a must-read by anybody interested in the topic of analyticity, and the nature of meaning generally.