Truth, Language, and History

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Donald Davidson, Truth, Language, and History, Oxford University Press, 2005, 376pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 019823757X.

Reviewed by Jeff Malpas, University of Tasmania


Donald Davidson is undoubtedly best known on the basis of the essays, dating from the 1960s and 1970s, contained in the two volumes published by Oxford University Press in 1980 and 1984, Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation and Essays on Actions and Events. It is these two volumes that provided the focus for the two volumes of critical essays edited by Ernest LePore and published by Basil Blackwell in the mid-1980s (Actions and Events, 1985 and Truth and Interpretation, 1986). Yet although Davidson's philosophical fame may have been established on the basis of his writings from the 1960s and 1970s, while much of the critical response to it was itself shaped by LePore's volumes, it was the period from the mid-1980s until his unexpected death in August 2003 that saw him at his most prolific and wide-ranging.

Already, in the early 1990s, Davidson had begun compiling a further two volumes of collected essays to add to the original two volumes. It was another ten years, however, before Davidson completed work on the first of these new volumes. Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective, the third volume of essays, appeared in 2004, as did revised editions of Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation and Essays on Actions and Events. Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective covers essays from the 1980s and early 1990s mostly focused around externalism and triangulation. The fourth volume in the series, Problems of Rationality, was complete, with the exception of the introduction, at the time of Davidson's death. Published in 2004, it brings together essays relating to the explanation and understanding of action, as well as issues of rationality and irrationality, with the essays coming mostly from the early 1980s and later 1990s (the break reflecting the way the focus of Davidson's thought had largely moved away from issues of action in the late 1980s and early 1990s). Truth, Language, and History is the completion of this five-volume series, a series that, together with the posthumously published monograph, Truth and Predication (Harvard: Harvard University Press, 2005), containing the exploration of the problem of the unity of the proposition which preoccupied much of Davidson's thinking for the last few years of his life, makes up the complete body of Davidson's philosophical oeuvre.

The essays contained in this final volume are ordered into four sections: 'Truth'; 'Language'; 'Anomalous Monism'; and 'Historical Thoughts'. The earliest of them (''Plato's Philosopher' and 'A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs') first appeared in 1984 and 1986, and the latest ('Aristotle's Action') in 2001, but the remaining seventeen come from the period 1989-1997, while the volume also contains Davidson's replies to a series of essays by Stroud, McDowell, Pereda and Rorty from 1998, as well as an introduction by Marcia Cavell. The volume retains the uniform format and appearance of the other four volumes, containing an account of the provenance of the essays, an introduction (the introduction to Problems of Rationality is also written by Marcia Cavell), bibliography, index, and in the case of this final volume, a complete listing of the contents of all five volumes.

While every one of the five volumes of Davidson's essays is a philosophical treasure trove, all containing influential and important essays, this final volume is especially interesting since it encompasses a number of key topics that are of special significance in Davidson's thinking.

One of these topics is, of course, the concept of truth, and it is this that is the focus for the first six essays included in the volume, essays such as 'Truth Rehabilitated' (1997), and 'The Folly of Trying to Define Truth' (1996). Davidson himself once commented, in conversation, that he felt that Rorty was one of the few contemporary philosophers who really understood his work, but he agreed that on one point, Rorty and he were nevertheless at odds, and the point was a crucial one, namely the centrality of truth. The focus on truth as a key concept is one of the explicit themes that run through Davidson's work from almost the very beginning through to the end. It plays a crucial role, of course, in Davidson's appropriation of Tarski, but as Davidson's own thinking developed, truth was important not only for the technical role it may have played in the account of a theory of meaning, but also as a pivotal notion in the Davidsonian account of interpretation and of language, and of the relation (if that is the right word) between language and the world. In my own work, Davidson's treatment of truth has been central to my, admittedly, perhaps, rather idiosyncratic attempts to connect Davidson's thinking with the hermeneutic tradition of Gadamer and Heidegger (a connection that Davidson seemed himself seemed to find, at the very least, intriguing).

Truth, according to Davidson, is a concept that is both fundamental, but also irreducible. It may be deployed to explicate other concepts, but it cannot itself be given any explication beyond the formal explication of 'truth-in'L' that is possible by means of a Tarskian truth definition -- indeed, any such definition already presupposes our prior grasp of truth as it operates in the meta-language. Not only is truth, as understood by Davidson, a fundamental and irreducible concept, but it also remains objective, and in this respect Davidson was resolutely anti-relativist. Of course, the truth of a sentence is dependent, not only on the way the world is, but also on the meaning of the sentence, and so one might say that truth is relative to language, but this is not a problematic form of relativisation. Moreover, since Davidson saw languages, not as formal or ideal structures, but as contingent phenomena constituted in and through the ongoing practice of speakers, and since he also saw truth as attaching to sentences, rather than to propositions, the existence of truth turns out, for Davidson, to be something that is contingent on the existence of speakers. Truth may be objective, but there is no body of eternal truths.

The centrality, and irreducibility, of truth is one of the main points of focus in this volume, but so too is the understanding of language, alluded to immediately above, as embedded in ongoing linguistic practice. This is a theme worked out in a number of essays in this volume, including three particularly important essays, 'A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs' (1986), 'The Social Aspect of Language' (1994), and 'Seeing Through Language' (1997). Also included is Davidson's essay on James Joyce, 'James Joyce and Humpty Dumpty' (1989). Joyce was one of Davidson's great loves, but Joyce's use of language was itself philosophical interesting to Davidson, and literature also provides a focus for Davidson's return to the analysis of metaphor and literality in 'Locating Literary Language' (1993). Davidson's discussion of the literary use of language, as well as the essay on Joyce, provides an important insight into the breadth of Davidson's own interests (although his literary erudition is evident at many places in his writing), and his capacity to engage with a range of materials and problems. Indeed, this is something further exemplified by the essay that follows the one on Joyce, 'The Third Man' (1972), which was originally written as a catalogue essay for Robert Morris's exhibition of works entitled 'Blind Time Drawings with Davidson'. Here Davidson draws connections between elements of his thinking and Morris' works -- works that themselves take quotations from Davidson's writing as a point of departure.

One of the characteristic features of much of Davidson's writing from the 1960s and 1970s was that there were only very sparse references to figures from the history of philosophy -- Kant and Hume were two of the few exceptions. It may have been thought, on that basis, that Davidson was a thoroughly ahistorical thinker, with little regard for or interest in the previous history of philosophical inquiry. Such was not the case, however, as the essays included in this volume under the heading 'Historical Thoughts' make plain. Davidson was a historian of ideas, studying under Whitehead, before being persuaded by Quine that the ideas were more important and interesting than the history, and although Davidson's knowledge of the history of philosophy often remained in the background of his writing, it was nevertheless always present.

Davidson's own PhD dissertation was written on Plato's Philebus, and the essay in which Davidson returns to this topic, in connection with the work of Gadamer (the essay was written for Gadamer's Library of Living Philosophers volume), is included here, as are essays on Plato and Socrates, on Aristotle, and on Spinoza. The essay on Spinoza, 'Spinoza's Causal Theory of the Affects' (1993), focuses on parallels between Spinoza's combination of substance monism with attribute dualism, and Davidson's own monism approach in the philosophy of mind. Alongside two other essays included here, 'Thinking Causes' (1993) and 'Laws and Causes' (1995), it provides important elaboration and clarification of the position that has come to be known as anomalous monism.

One of the great merits of this volume is that it does indeed give a sense of the breadth of Davidson's thinking, and of the extent to which it extended beyond the usual confines of traditional 'analytic' philosophy. While Davidson was thoroughly embedded with the American analytic tradition, especially as developed under the influence of Quine, he was also strongly influenced by Aristotle, by Kant and by Wittgenstein, and his thinking often used the vocabulary, techniques and concepts of analytic thought in ways that took that thinking in quite different and radical directions. Indeed, the radical and idiosyncratic character of Davidson's thinking is still, it seems to me, very much underappreciated and often unrecognised -- the tendency being to assimilate his ideas to more familiar and traditional ways of proceeding. Perhaps this is partly what explains the widespread tendency in much of the contemporary analytic reading of Davidson, in spite of the detailed discussions his view have attracted, to treat the actual positions Davidson has advanced as almost invariably mistaken.

Davidson himself was certainly somewhat bemused by the way in which his views attracted so much opposition, not, I think, because of any special sensitivity to criticism on his part, but because he saw his thinking as attempting to articulate certain absolutely basic and simple insights. Admittedly Davidson's own sometimes dense and often highly polished style of writing has sometimes been a barrier to the easy assimilation of his ideas, while the fact that his work has, apart from the final monograph, always taken the form of essays, often first appearing in widely dispersed locations, has also made it harder for his thinking to be grasped in its entirety. The hope is that the publication of the essays in this volume, along with the essays included in the other four, as well as the material contained in Truth and Predication, will eventually give rise to a more integrated appreciation of Davidson's work -- work that constitutes one of the landmarks of twentieth-century philosophy irrespective of tradition.