Truth, Meaning and Realism: Essays in the Philosophy of Thought

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A. C. Grayling, Truth, Meaning and Realism: Essays in the Philosophy of Thought, Continuum, 2007, 173pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847061546.

Reviewed by Alexander Miller, University of Birmingham


This volume is a collection of revised versions of ten essays apparently written in the 1980s or thereabouts, mainly as invited contributions to conferences. As Grayling admits in his preface, "All the papers are of their time". British philosophy in the 1970s and 1980s was dominated by an approach to the debate between realism and antirealism that was associated with Oxford and championed by Michael Dummett, and according to which the key issue was whether the theory of meaning should take as its central concept the notion of truth or the notion of assertibility, with realism favouring the former and antirealism favouring the latter. Much of the book concerns the realism debate conceived in these terms, and although there are also extended discussions of Putnam's twin-earth examples these are mainly in the context of an exchange with David Wiggins. Grayling's essays are thus also very much "of their place" (Oxford) as well as of their time (1980s).

Although in his early works Dummett had defended the idea that assertibility, and not truth, should be the central concept of the theory of meaning, in later work he -- and Crispin Wright -- suggested that antirealism could after all take the notion of truth to be the central notion of the theory of meaning so long as it was an epistemically constrained notion. Given this way of formulating antirealism there is no need to argue that the notion of assertion can be explained in terms that don't presuppose the notion of truth: even the antirealist can admit that it is a platitude that "to assert is to present as true".

In Essay 1, Grayling puts forward a view of assertion that contrasts with the approach of Wright and the later Dummett. Whereas the Wright-later Dummett view sees the aim of assertion as "the presentation of or laying claim to truth" (p.10), Grayling sees it as "the realisation of certain cognitive and practical goals" (ibid.).

Essay 2 proposes a recasting of the debate between realism and antirealism. Grayling suggests that (a) properly understood realism is not a metaphysical but an epistemological thesis: "that the domains or entities to which ontological commitment is made exist independently of knowledge of them" (p.26); and that (b) it is in fact a second-order debate about whether the realistic commitments of ordinary, first-order discourse are literally true or not, and as such has no implications for "logic, linguistic practice, or mundane metaphysics" (p.30). Grayling returns to these issues in Essays 8 and 9.

An alternative to deflationary and indefinabilist conceptions of truth is offered in Essay 3: "The predicate 'is true' is a lazy predicate. It holds a place for more precise predicates, denoting evaluatory properties appropriate to the discourse in which possession of those properties is valued" (p.32). On this view "there are, literally, different kinds of truth, individuated by subject-matter" (p.36). Grayling backs this up in Essay 4 (which, like Essay 3, is a reworked chapter from Grayling's An Introduction to Philosophical Logic, first published in 1982) with a critique of the indefinabilist position Davidson recommends in "The Folly of Trying to Define Truth". This essay also argues that Davidson's "The Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge" fails to yield a satisfying account of objectivity: in particular "the principle of charity is questionable beyond its heuristic applications" (p.49).

Putnam's famous "twin-earth" argument appears to some to establish that it is essential to Jones's thinking the thought that someone is drinking water in the next room that there is (or has been) some H20 in Jones's environment. In Essay 5 Grayling considers Wiggins's attempt to fuse this construal of Putnam's insight -- "the extension-involvingness of natural kind terms" (p.62) -- with a Fregean theory distinguishing between the sense and reference of such a term. For Wiggins,

Taking the sense of a name as its mode of presentation of an object means that we have two things … : an object that the name presents, and a way in which it is presented. This latter [is] the 'conception' of the object … 'a body of information' -- typically open-ended and imperfect, and hence rarely if ever condensable into a complete description of the object -- in which the object itself plays a role (p.62),

and something similar holds for natural kind terms: "the sense of a natural kind term is correlative to a recognitional conception that is unspecifiable except as the conception of things like this, that and the other specimens exemplifying the concept that this conception is a conception of" (p.65). Grayling suggests that instead of taking senses to be "correlative" to "conceptions" we should instead identify senses with conceptions: "a term's sense is: an open-ended extensible body of information, possession of which enables speakers to identify the term's reference" (p.69). However, this modified account has consequences for the notion of extension-involving sense:

on the minimum specification given for the grasp of the sense of a concept-word, any concept word which applies to nothing retains its sense because what is known by one who understands it is what would count as an exemplary instance of its application if ever one were offered. (p.74)

In consequence, Wiggins was wrong to take it "that the extension-involvingness constraint ensured the realism of the reality-involvingness he took this to entail" (p.75). Related matters are pursued in Essay 6. Grayling rejects Frege's "strong objectivism" about sense, and argues that since the publicity of sense "is essentially a matter of speakers' mutual constrainings of use", it is best construed in terms of "intersubjective agreement in use" (p.85). This has implications for the externalist arguments of Putnam and Burge. Although it is true that meanings are not in the head of any single speaker, "they are in our heads, collectively understood … meaning is the artefact of intersubjectively constituted conventions governing the use of sounds and marks to communicate, and therefore resides in the language itself" (p.89). This shows -- contra Putnam -- that "facts about the physical environment of language-use are not essential to meaning" (p.89). Grayling reaches this conclusion by reflecting on what he calls an "Explicit Speaker", an idealised speaker who knows everything contained in "some best and latest dictionary [which] pooled a community's knowledge of meanings" (p.87). It follows that

when he [an individual speaker with the linguistic community's best joint knowledge at his disposal] says 'water' he intends to refer to water, that is, H20, or if he lives on twin-earth, then to water on twin-earth, that is, XYZ; and so in either case his grasp of the expression's meaning determines its extension, and the psychological state in which his grasp of the meaning consists is broad. But this is not because it is related, causally or in some other way, to water, but rather to theories of water, because he is speaking in conformity with the best dictionary, that is, with the fullest available knowledge of meaning, in accord with the best current theories held by the linguistic community. (p.88)

Grayling does not consider the obvious reply that a defender of Putnam might give: that a 10th century English peasant's application of "water" to a sample of XYZ is incorrect, and clearly not because of anything to do with the best current theory held by his linguistic community. Moreover, it appears to beg the question against Putnam to assume that, in the late-20th century scenario that Grayling is concerned with, facts about the physical environment are not essential to grasp the meanings of some of the expressions that appear in "the best current theories held by the linguistic community".

The "Explicit Speaker" reappears in Essay 7. As Grayling advertises in the preface, this chapter suggests that "point is the driving force in interpretation of implicatures by competent speakers of a natural language" (, and that "this simple insight reveals certain puzzles to be artefacts of inexplictness" (ibid.). According to Grayling:

An Explicit Speaker of his language is one who so uses it whenever he makes an assertion (and mutatis mutandis for other kinds of utterance) he: (1) expresses his intended meaning as fully as, if not more fully than, his audience needs in the circumstances; (2) expresses his intended meaning as exactly as, if not more exactly than, his audience, etc; and (3) is as epistemically cautious as the circumstances do or might require, if not more so, with respect to the claims made or presupposed by what he says. (p.93)

Grayling proposes to deploy this notion of an Explicit Speaker to shed light on the analogues in natural language of the logical constants, presupposition-failure in uses of the likes of "Jones omitted to turn out the light", the distinction between referential and attributive uses of definite descriptions, and Putnam's use of twin-earth type examples. This chapter is difficult to follow. Although it is titled "Explicit Speaker Theory", and although the expression "Explicit Speaker Theory" is mentioned throughout, Grayling never gives a clear and explicit statement of what the theory actually is. The reader is left to work this out from inexplicit hints. We are told, for example, that according to Explicit Speaker Theory "the crux in meaning is the point, which is to be explained in terms of speakers' intentions to mean something on an occasion" (p.92), that "conventional meaning is to be characterised as the dry residue of speakers' meanings, agreed in the language community under constraints of publicity and stability" (ibid.), that "the meanings of expressions in a language are the agreed dry residue of speakers' meanings" (p.105), and that "what the Explicit Speaker does [when he says "the man whom I take to be drinking champagne is happy tonight"] is what all speakers are enthymematically doing anyway" (p.102). (Grayling does not attempt to explain what it is to do something enthymematically: again, the reader is left to work this out for himself.) In the light of this, readers with less sunny temperaments than the present reviewer are likely to be irritated by comments like "One should surely recognise all this as obvious" (p.100).

That Essay 8 is very much of its time and place is evident from its characterisation as "current orthodoxy" of the view that the realism/antirealism dispute is a debate about whether linguistic understanding is a matter of grasp of epistemically unconstrained truth-conditions or a matter of grasp of assertion conditions. For "current orthodoxy" read "orthodoxy in Oxford in the 1980s", and -- accordingly -- the essay is largely taken up with a discussion of Dummett's analysis of realism as the view that grasp of sentence-meaning is grasp of potentially evidence-transcendent truth-conditions. Grayling argues that rather than attempting in this way to bring all realist/antirealist controversies under one label, we should instead "recognise that they are controversies of different kinds" (p.126). This point is now well-taken -- and indeed defended -- even by philosophers out of the Dummettian stable (cf. Crispin Wright, Truth and Objectivity (Harvard University Press 1992)). However, in contrast to Wright, Grayling argues not that we can develop different realism-relevant considerations that can be brought to bear in different combinations as we move across different discourses, but rather that "we do well to restrict talk of realism to the case where controversy concerns unmetaphorical claims about the knowledge-independent existence of entities or realms of entities -- namely, the 'external world' case" (p.126).

Grayling's argument for this surprising claim is unconvincing. Dummett argues that realism is most fundamentally a semantic thesis, "a doctrine about the sort of thing that makes our statements true when they are true" (quoted by Grayling on p.120), since in some cases a straightforwardly ontological characterisation in terms of the existence of entities is not possible because there are no entities for the realist and antirealist to debate about (Dummett mentions realism about the future and realism about ethics as examples). Grayling argues against this that the semantic thesis is actually less fundamental than realism characterised in metaphysical and epistemological terms on the grounds that Dummett "goes on to unpack the expression 'sort of thing' in a way which shows that its being a semantic thesis comes courtesy of something else" (p.120). To display this Grayling quotes the following passage from Dummett:

the fundamental thesis of realism, so regarded, is that we really do succeed in referring to external objects, existing independently of our knowledge of them, and that the statements we make about them are rendered true or false by an objective reality the constitution of which is, again, independent of our knowledge. (Note that this is not, as Grayling refers to it, on p.55 of Dummett's 1982 "Realism" article, but actually on p.104.)

Grayling takes the reference to external objects in this latter characterisation to show that the semantic characterisation of realism presupposes the ontological characterisation rather than, as Dummett has it, vice versa. It then follows from this that "what we should say about those 'realisms' which are not readily classifiable in terms of entities is, simply, and on Dummett's own reasoning, that they are not realisms" (p.125), and it is this that leads in part to Grayling's restriction of talk of realism to the 'external world' case.

But this is an uncharitable interpretation of Dummett. I take it that what Dummett is saying in the passage quoted by Grayling is actually along the following lines: "the fundamental thesis of realism, so regarded, is that in cases where there is a relevant class of entities whose existence can be a matter of debate, the statements we make about them are rendered true or false by an objective reality the constitution of which is independent of our knowledge, so that in this sense we really do succeed in referring to external objects, existing independently of our knowledge of them; and that in cases where there is no relevant class of entities whose existence can be a matter of debate, the canonical statements of the discourse concerned are rendered true or false by an objective reality the constitution of which is independent of our knowledge". Read in this more charitable way it is clear that the class of entities mentioned is secondary to the mention of knowledge-independent truth, and so there is no implication that talk of realism should be restricted to the "external world" case, so that the way is left open for a Wright-style broadening of the realist/antirealist canvass.

Essay 9 is an extended discussion of McGinn, Nagel and McFetridge on the realism debate, while the final Essay 10 offers some brief reflections on evidence and judgement.

It is not straightforward to appraise this collection, as it is not clear what its target audience is. The various debates have moved on quite a way since Grayling's conference papers were written, and I can't help feeling that they should have been updated and submitted to the rigours of peer-review in the journals before being issued in a collection. To be fair to Grayling, though, he does attempt to pre-empt this kind of worry in his preface, where he points to the "exploratory character" of the essays and says that he "in no case take[s] them to be remotely near a final word on the debates they relate to" (p.v). But I'm not sure that this is enough to get Grayling off the hook. My main problem with the book is not that it is exploratory (there's nothing wrong with that), or that its approach is parochial and somewhat dated, but that the writing style displays some of the worst vices of philosophical writing a la 1980s Oxford, where writing clearly and succinctly appears to be regarded as a mark of superficiality, and where as you get nearer to the nub of an argument, the cruder the stylistic barbarities become. The following example -- of a single sentence! -- from Essay 5 is, unfortunately, not atypical:

Generalising from natural kind terms, we might wish to say that concept words which, in Frege's terminology, refer to empty concepts, can nevertheless be understood, because we can be (so to say) lexically exposed to -- it is more accurate to say: given an understanding of what it would be for something to fall into -- the extensions they would, in better or fuller worlds, have. (p.74)

I'm here reminded of Schopenhauer's comment that "when parentheses are inserted into sentences that have been broken up to accommodate them" the result is "unnecessary and wanton confusion" (Essays and Aphorisms, trans. R.J. Hollingdale (Penguin 1970), p.207). At any rate, the cause of serious philosophy is not furthered by the poor attempt at Henry James impersonation. Grayling writes:

Too many gifted colleagues publish too little for fear of having every nut and bolt tightened into place; those who venture ideas as if they were letters to friends, trying out a way of thinking about something, and knowing that they will learn from the mistakes they make, do more both for the conversation and themselves thereby. (p.v)

Far be it from me to dictate Grayling's epistolary habits, but if his style in this book is typical of the way he writes to his friends, I'll give his collected correspondence a miss.