Truth-Seeking by Abduction

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Ilkka Niiniluoto, Truth-Seeking by Abduction, Springer, 2018, 185pp., $109.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319991566.

Reviewed by Jonah N. Schupbach, University of Utah


In clarifying the category of induction (epagoge), Aristotle inverts the deductive Barbara syllogism, exchanging its major premise and conclusion (Prior Analytics 68b15-29).[1] The resulting form encompasses arguments "from the particular to the universal." C. S. Peirce (1839-1914) suggested as early as 1865 that a "third form of inference", worthy of special philosophical attention, is revealed by inverting the syllogism in the other possible way, exchanging its conclusion and minor premise (see Figure 1).


(a) Deduction (Barbara)

(b) Induction

(c) Abduction



 All bileless animals are long-lived.
 Man, horse, etc. are bileless animals.
 Man, horse, etc. are long-lived.

∴ ∀x(Fx→Gx)

Man, horse, etc. are long-lived.
Man, horse, etc. are bileless animals.
 All bileless animals are long-lived.

∴ Fb

All bileless animals are long-lived.
Man, horse, etc. are long-lived.

 Man, horse, etc. are bileless animals.

Figure 1. Peirce's three categories of inference illustrated using an example from Aristotle. Induction and Abduction are shown as alternate inversions of a singular instance of Barbara, formulated in modern, first-order logic.


Peirce argues that such "abduction" (named after Aristotle's apagoge) "concludes the existence of a fact quite different from anything observed, from which, according to known laws, something observed would necessarily result" (CP 2.536). It is, in Peirce's words, an "explanatory syllogism," moving in reverse "from effect to cause" and providing "scientific understanding" by concluding explanations of observed facts. Peirce grappled with this category of inference for the remainder of his life, repeatedly modifying his specific claims pertaining to its form and application (and often changing the name he gave it).

In work spanning the past forty years, Ilkka Niiniluoto has continued Peirce's project of understanding abduction. While the topic remains difficult and hotly contested in philosophy today, Niiniluoto has done much to clarify the issues at stake along with fruitful ways to go about settling them. His latest monograph provides an integrated statement of this work.

This is not your standard analytic philosophy book in which all of the chapters crisply argue for points that collectively build a case toward a single thesis. Instead, the book has broad, multifaceted aims. It explores a rich assortment of material, including enjoyable excursions through the history of the subject, original illustrations of abductive reasoning at work (i.e., outside of the well-worn, canonical examples), a survey of past and contemporary philosophical research on the subject, as well as a good dose of original work that develops such research.

The book is short, clocking in under 200 pages. Its brevity makes for a concise statement of some important work on the topic. However, there are some negative effects when a short book pursues such broad aims. Specifically in this case, its short length results in some conspicuous absences (some of which I will mention below). These absences are unfortunate, first, since the book has the appearance of a general survey of the philosophical work on abduction; readers who treat it as such will not be introduced to some popular, recent trends in the field. And second, the book consequently occasionally leaves matters unclear when it comes to connecting the work that Niiniluoto does include with these recent developments.

Even so, Niiniluoto's impressive work demands attention, and this book is a one-stop shop for gathering his thoughts on the subject. It helpfully and rigorously develops important aspects of the study of abduction that often go missing in much of the mainstream literature today. It lends historical grounding to the subject. And it provides the reader with a broad view of the various, distinct perspectives philosophers have taken regarding abduction. For these reasons especially, the book is an important and highly recommended contribution to the field.

Niiniluoto begins by providing examples and historical context for the study. Chapter 1 ("Peirce on Abduction") discusses Peirce's evolving thoughts on abduction. Niiniluoto then summarizes the different interpretations of abduction that Peirce's followers and contemporary philosophers propose. Chapters 2 ("Analysis and Synthesis") and 4 ("Inverse Problems") give the reader an idea of how broadly abductive reasoning applies through some fascinating and unexpected illustrations. Niiniluoto finds an interesting historical precedent for Peircean abduction in the method of analysis prevalent in ancient Greek geometry -- most famously described by Pappas (ca. 300 AD). As opposed to the method of synthesis, by which theorems are directly proven from their grounding axioms, analysis infers inversely (in Pappas's words, by "regression" or "reduction backward") from a desired theorem to its axiomatic base(s). Other illustrations include some that are more familiar (detective stories, medical diagnosis, phylogenetic inference), and others that are less so (Edgar Allan Poe's philosophy of poetic composition, diagnostic applications of Radon's theorem in computerized tomography, stemmatic reasoning in textual criticism).

These historical and illustrative chapters set the stage for the others by motivating and introducing crucial questions and possible answers/approaches. Some of these questions have to do with the very nature and form of abduction. Others pertain to abduction's application and normative status.

Chapter 3 ("Abduction and Logic") primarily concerns the first set of questions related to abduction's nature and form. Here, Niiniluoto considers a variety of ways that researchers in formal logic and Artificial Intelligence have formulated and used abduction. These include formulations using paraconsistent logic, non-propositional accounts, formal-structural rules, semantic tableaux, an "ignorance-preserving approach" due to Gabbay and Woods (2005), and Hintikka's interrogative logical approach. Citing Peirce's "ethics of terminology" (CP 2.219-226) as motivation, Niiniluoto's consistent standard of evaluation throughout this survey is the extent to which the various formulations stay true to Peirce's own original thoughts on abduction. Especially because, as noted above, Peirce's claims about abduction constitute something of a moving target, there is room for multiple, useful formulations and approaches. The result is that Niiniluoto's survey is mostly positive, often including his own suggestions for improving particular accounts.

One exception is his criticism of the ignorance-preserving approach for, as he convincingly argues, being "clearly different from Peirce's account of abduction." Niiniluoto's terminological ethical standard certainly demonstrates the importance he places on maintaining a connection to Peirce. However, his use of this standard simultaneously makes it unclear whether the complaint is ultimately more than merely terminological. In this case, it's left unclear whether Niiniluoto's criticism amounts merely to a terminological slap on the wrist: Gabbay and Woods ought not have called their account "abductive".

Chapter 5 ("Abduction as Discovery and Pursuit") turns to the question of what uses we might have for abductive reasoning. Peirce suggests one very important application when he writes, "all the ideas of science come to it by way of abduction" (CP 5.145). Starting with N. R. Hanson's Patterns of Discovery (1958), philosophers have explored this Peircean idea by considering abduction's merits as a "logic of discovery". Hanson describes the logic of discovery using Peirce's most famous formulation of abduction:

Some surprising phenomenon C is observed

C would be explicable as a matter of course if H were true.

Hence, there is reason to think that H is true.

Niiniluoto notes that the standard criticism of such a view is that this formulation could not provide insight into the cognitive process by which we generate H in the first place, since H already occurs in its second premise (e.g., see Laudan 1980, p. 174). In response, as Niiniluoto outlines, one might distinguish discovery as generation from selection. In the latter case, we already have a hypothesis space generated; "discoveries" occur relative to such a space when we abductively select potential explanations from this space to pursue in further (inductive) testing.

For my part, I wonder whether there is any need for such a maneuver. The criticism seems to misunderstand the task of a logic. It is in the realm of psychology, history, and other disciplines to analyze the process by which discoveries (interpreted generatively) are made. By contrast, a logic of discovery aims to analyze the relevant (and atemporal) logical relations characteristic when discoveries are made. To the extent that the logic guides us in the process of discovery, it does so by insisting we look to generate hypotheses bearing the desired relation(s) to our evidence. I see no obvious problem with the claim that Peirce's formulation of abduction goes some way toward describing the logical relations that obtain when discoveries are made, however that temporal process ends up being best analyzed.

Niiniluoto ends this chapter with comments suggesting that abduction could be useful as a logic of discovery (or "pursuit") while simultaneously being justificatory. Here, he is effectively calling into question the allegedly sharp distinction between contexts of discovery and justification. This suggestion coincides with illustrations given by Niiniluoto earlier in the book in which the same abduction seems to work in both contexts (e.g., the example of computerized tomography on p. 61).

The next three chapters defend abduction as a justificatory mode of reasoning. Niiniluoto asserts that Peirce himself consistently thought of abduction as being a (perhaps weakly) reliable mode of inference; indeed, in some cases (e.g., the abductive inference to the existence of Napoleon Bonaparte), Peirce insists that abduction provides us with conclusions that are strongly compelling and undeniable (CP 2.54, 2.229-230). In chapters 6 and 7 ("Abduction and Confirmation" and "Inference to the Best Explanation"), in an admittedly anti-Peircean move, Niiniluoto applies a probabilistic, Bayesian approach. His aim is to explore connections between explanation and (Bayesian) confirmation and/or justified acceptance.

These chapters are, to my mind, one place where some widely discussed, recent developments in the study of abduction unfortunately go missing. In chapter 6, the connections that Niiniluoto develops and defends relate to somewhat questionable and/or outdated criteria for explanation. For example, he argues that "the Bayesian approach immediately justifies the idea that explanatory success is confirmatory or credence-increasing" (95, emphasis in original) by establishing the following result: "If H deductively or inductively explains E, then E PR-confirms H [i.e., Pr(H|E)>Pr(H)]." The notion of "deductive explanation" builds upon Hempel and Oppenheim's DN model using structural rules to pick out a particular "explanatory" class of entailment relations. A well-known result in the Bayesian literature shows that, for any contingent H and E, so long as H entails E, E confirms H in the standard incremental sense: Pr(H|E)>Pr(H). This connection, though sound, is arguably of very limited applicability; rarely, if ever, are scientific explanations cleanly deductive in the desired sense.

Alternatively, Niiniluoto simply identifies the notion of "inductive explanation" with the "positive relevance condition" (i.e., the above, target inequality). Niiniluoto claims that "this is the basic idea behind Salmon's SR-model." However, while this is true of the early SR-account, Salmon's more developed account associates explanation with statistical relevance, be it positive or negative. In the latter case, explanation is disconfirmatory, Pr(H|E)<Pr(H), the exact opposite result of what Niiniluoto seeks to establish. A more foundational discussion of inductive explanation, tying it more securely to positive relevance, would have been helpful in this section of the book.

Recent work has focused more on exploring connections between various explanatory virtues (and combinations thereof) and Bayesian confirmation -- a nice sample of such recent work can be found in (McCain and Poston 2017). Niiniluoto's chapter starts this way, but the work it presents and cites is decidedly dated. It focuses on work up through Lipton (2004) on explanatory power, along with Myrvold (2003) and McGrew's (2003) work on unification. But a great deal has been written on these and related topics in the last 15 years. For example, much has been written during that time developing work on explanatory power in original and potentially fruitful ways (e.g., Colombo et al. 2017; Schupbach 2017; Glass 2018). Additionally, there are of course many alleged explanatory virtues other than power and unification, which again have been discussed in varying levels of detail in recent work.

Other unfortunate absences come in chapter 7's discussion of Inference to the Best Explanation. For example, Niiniluoto remarks briefly on van Fraassen's criticism of a "bonus points" version of abductive updating. He also includes a section at the end of chapter 8 ("Abductive Belief Revision") that deals exclusively with abductive modifications to AGM-theory. However, he says nothing about Igor Douven's recent, influential research program developing this bonus-points picture of Inference to the Best Explanation into defensible normative (Douven, Forthcoming) and descriptive (Douven and Schupbach, 2015) models of credence updating.

The upshot is that, while the material that Niiniluoto includes in these chapters does helpfully sketch the general shape of Bayesian approaches to the subject, it also neglects ways in which this work has progressed in the last 15 years. Readers may be misled into thinking that not much has happened on these topics recently. In reality, Bayesian work on abduction and Inference to the Best Explanation has only become increasingly popular during that time.

Chapter 8 ("Abduction and Truthlikeness") relates abduction in important ways to Niiniluoto's excellent work on notions of truthlikeness and approximate truth (Niiniluoto 1987). Niiniluoto notes that "explanatory and predictive success in science is often approximate," and that abductive reasoning is regularly, knowingly used to conclude the approximate truth of literally false conclusions. He evaluates such uses of abduction using a measure of expected verisimilitude. And he shows, for example, that such a version of abduction has applications to reasoning with idealized models in science.

The book concludes, in chapter 9 ("Abduction and Scientific Realism"), with a rewarding discussion of a well-known philosophical application of abductive reasoning. Niiniluoto applies the work he has set out in earlier chapters in order to develop and defend an abductive no-miracles argument for scientific realism. He applies the Bayesian tools once more for this purpose, but now combined in interesting ways with his appeal to verisimilitude. Specifically, he defends the critical realist position that the best scientific theories are "truthlike or approximately true." Such critical realism is not merely the best explanation of the empirical and pragmatic success of theories, according to Niiniluoto, but it is in fact the only viable explanation.

If this book's main weakness is its failure to confront some important, recent work on abduction, its primary strength is its success in renewing our attention on important approaches and questions that are perhaps not currently getting the consideration they deserve. I suspect that Niiniluoto's aims in writing this book did not include providing a complete, up-to-date survey of cutting-edge work on the topic. Either way, by reaffirming abduction's Peircean roots, by reviewing some of the host of distinct, plausible formulations of abduction, and by clarifying and defending abduction's various applications (pragmatic and epistemic), Niiniluoto's book constitutes an important and welcome new contribution to our understanding of abductive reasoning.


I owe special thanks to Ilkka Niiniluoto and Jonathan Livengood for their helpful feedback on a draft of this review.


Colombo, M., L. Bucher, and J. Sprenger. Determinants of judgments of explanatory power: Credibility, generality, and statistical relevance. Frontiers in Psychology, 8:1430, 2017.

Douven, I. The ecological rationality of explanatory reasoning. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, Forthcoming.

Douven, I. and J. N. Schupbach. The role of explanatory considerations in updating. Cognition, 142:299-311, 2015.

Gabbay, D. M. and J. Woods. The Reach of Abduction: Insight and Trial. Elsevier, Amsterdam, 2005

Glass, D. H. Coherence, explanation, and hypothesis selection. The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 2018.

Laudan, L. Why was the logic of discovery abandoned? In T. Nickles, editor, Scientific Discovery, Logic, and Rationality, pages 173-183. Springer Netherlands, Dordrecht, 1980.

McCain, K. and T. Poston, editors. Best Explanations: New Essays on Inference to the Best Explanation. Oxford University Press, Oxford, 2017.

McGrew, T. Confirmation, heuristics, and explanatory reasoning. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 54:553-567, 2003.

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Myrvold, W. C. A Bayesian account of the virtue of unification. Philosophy of Science, 70:399-423, April 2003.

Niiniluoto, I. Truthlikeness. D. Reidel, Dordrecht, 1987.

Peirce, C. S. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, volume I-VI. Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass, 1931-1935.

Schupbach, J. N. Inference to the Best Explanation, cleaned up and made respectable. In K. McCain and T. Poston, editors, Best Explanations, pages 39-61. Oxford University Press, Oxford, 2017.

[1] As usual, interpretive questions arise as to whether this is really what Aristotle was up to in this passage. See (Milton 2009, sect 1.2) for discussion.