Truth: Studies of a Robust Presence

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Kurt Pritzl, O.P. (ed.), Truth: Studies of a Robust Presence, Catholic University of America Press, 2010, 368pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813216805.

Reviewed by Nicholaos Jones, University of Alabama in Huntsville



“What is truth?” is asked in many ways. Often it is a question about the nature of truth, concerning the conditions under which something is true. Sometimes it is a question about whether the bearers of truth are utterances, sentences, propositions, or beliefs. Pritzl bills this collection as focusing on truth as a “substantial and dominant reality in the lived experience of human persons as rational agents” (2). The volume’s avowed aim is “to contribute to discussion about truth in a way that enriches and amplifies strictly formal and logical considerations about truth so that its substantial or robust character can be better assessed and appreciated” (2). Accordingly, the essays largely avoid discussions about the nature or bearers of truth, focusing instead on issues connected to two questions: what is it in virtue of which there is truth, and what are some methods and constraints on our attaining true beliefs?

Four essays discuss truthmakers. Timothy Noone and Jan Aertsen’s essays survey medieval responses to a problem from Christian philosophy, namely, how to reconcile the apparent plurality of truths with the metaphysical constraint that one being, God, is truth. This problem concerns what Noone calls ontological truth, truth understood as eternal, immutable, and that in virtue of which the world is intelligible. Ontological truth contrasts with what Noone calls logical truth, that which obtains when we say of what is that it is and of what is not that it is not.

In “Truth, Creation, and Intelligiblity in Anselm, Grosseteste, and Bonaventure”, Noone discusses a problem about ontological truth for medieval philosophers. Augustine argues that God is (ontological) truth because, within the Biblical world-view, only God is eternal and immutable. Anselm elaborates Augustine’s sketchy account, distinguishing between truths of speech, of thought, of will, of things, and the Highest Truth, that by virtue of which all created things receive their being. (These kinds of truth seem to attach, respectively, to declarations, beliefs, actions, created beings, and God. For example, it seems that an action has truth if it is morally right and a thing has truth if it exists.) According to Noone, Anselm’s rich account raises three problems, all based upon the presumption that the Highest Truth is the cause of all truth and the effect of none. First, since the Highest Truth is also eternal and immutable, it is not clear how there can be a difference between contingent truths and necessary ones. Second, since there is, according to Anselm, only one Highest Truth, it is not clear how the many manifestations of truth relate to the Highest Truth. Finally, since the Highest Truth is a truthmaker for everything, it is not clear what role there is for the truths of things. (Noone does not discuss whether the Highest Truth’s singularity creates similar problems for the truths of speech, thought, and will.)

Noone shows how both Grosseteste and Bonaventure attempt to solve two of these problems. Grosseteste argues, against Anselm, that truth is many rather than one, and he also argues that whereas necessary truths are inevitable, contingent truths were able to be otherwise. Bonaventure offers a compromise between Anselm and Grosseteste, arguing that truth is one, insofar as it is God and thereby admits no admixture, but many, insofar as it opposes falsehood. Bonaventure also proposes a genuine role for the truths of things: in depending upon the Highest Truth (God), created things are signs that point beyond themselves to that Truth.

Aertsen continues Noone’s survey with “Truth in the Middle Ages: Its Essence and Power in Christian Thought”, discussing Aquinas’ and Nicholas of Cusa’s accounts of truth. Aertsen surveys Aquinas’ views on the fact that “‘true’ is a property that belongs to every being”, the definition of truth, analogous predication, and the plurality of truths. His discussion of Cusanus focuses on the idea that all human knowledge (apart from mathematics) is conjectural because “truth in its precision is unattainable to us” (145). (This seems to mean that our true beliefs are limited by our perspectives.) Aertsen situates Aquinas’ account as a critical response to Anselm’s, and Cusanus’ as a critical response to Aquinas’.

Noone suggests that medieval accounts of (ontological) truth are “very much limited by and defined by a Christian metaphysics of creation” (125). This strikes me as largely correct. Nonetheless, there is recent debate, within a secular framework, concerning whether there are many truthmakers or, instead, one truthmaker (the world).1 If some kind of modal realism is true, so that the world is only one of many possible worlds, the world is unlike God (because there are other possible worlds but only one possible God) and contemporary truthmaker monists do not face the medieval problem of distinguishing contingent truths from necessary ones. Moreover, although contemporary discussion abandons medieval metaphysical constraints (such as the requirement that truthmakers be eternal), there is at least some potential for plundering medieval debates for contemporary currency, because of the structural similarity between debates about how to reconcile a singular truthmaker with a plurality of truths.

The collection contains two further essays about truthmakers. Neither essay discusses issues that presume significant prior metaphysical commitments (about, say, the nature of God). Brian Bix’s “Will versus Reason: Truth in Natural Law, Positive Law, and Legal Theory” surveys contemporary accounts of truthmakers for legal propositions. He frames the accounts as attempts to assess the relative importance of reason-based and will-based factors. Reason-based accounts emphasize the role of arguments that appeal to the (timeless) merits of actions and institutions, while will-based accounts emphasize the role of (contingent) choices by individuals and institutions. Bix shows how the main accounts tend to privilege one factor over the other. In Bix’s view, Austin’s command theory, common sense, and legal positivism emphasize will at the expense of reason, while accounts from Dworkin, Patterson, and Bobbitt emphasize reason at the expense of will. Bix concludes with some reflections on the need for an adequate account that balances these factors. His thesis, in brief, is that two aspects of legal practice demand attention to both factors: the fact that official decisions often have authority to make law, even when they mistakenly interpret legal texts, shows that there is an important role for will-based factors; the fact that the same decisions can be mistaken shows that there is an important role for reason-based ones. Bix’s essay might fruitfully connect with recent work on truth pluralism. For example, Michael Lynch appeals to considerations about truthmakers for legal propositions in arguing against a universal theory of truth.2

In “Truth and Identity: The Thomistic Telescope”, John Milbank discusses truthmakers for propositions about universals, individual substances, numbers, and sets, arguing against nominalist views in favor of a wedding between Thomistic realism and Cusanic conjecturalism. There are some rich ideas in this essay, such as the suggestion that “every creature exists by diagonalizing out of its finitude through participation” (305). Unfortunately, the writing and argumentation are often difficult to follow; Milbank frequently misunderstands modern logic, mathematics, and set theory; and he does not bother to develop his more intriguing claims. Three examples: (1) It is hard to understand what Milbank means when he writes, “Truth … requires identity. But this is found only in incomprehensible infinite non-identity in which this world incomprehensibly participates” (305). My best guess: Milbank is referring to the medieval idea that God is the ontological foundation for the multiplicity of things in the world. (2) This strikes me as clearly false: "Frege and Russell attempted to reduce every ‘is’ of predication to the ‘is’ of pure identity: ‘x is y’ is then only comprehensible as x = y where ‘equals’ spells identity" (288). (3) Milbank hastily dismisses many kinds of nominalism. His arguments tend to instantiate a puzzling form: first, briefly motivate a particular nominalist (and often medieval) view about some subject matter; second, show that there exists a kind of medieval realism that, if correct, would entail the falsity of that view; third, infer that any version of nominalism about that subject matter is mistaken. For instance: Ockham and Duns Scotus, among others, give a nominalist account of universals (281-284); Jean Poinsot and other Coimbrists develop a theory of signs incompatible with nominalism (285-287); so nominalism about universals fails.

Four essays in the volume address methods for attaining true beliefs. In “Aristotle’s Door”, Kurt Pritzl presents Aristotle’s views on the role of perception, intellection, and intuition. In "A More ‘Exact Grasp’ of the Soul? Tripartition in the Republic and Dialectic in the Philebus", Mitchell Miller discusses Plato’s view of dialectic as a method for revealing unity in apparent multiplicity. (This discussion is not obviously related to issues about truth and is incidental to the main focus of Miller’s essay, which is to offer a particular interpretation of the “longer path” to understanding the soul that Plato has Socrates mention, but not pursue, in the Republic.) Robert Wood’s “Art and Truth: From Plato through Nietzsche to Heidegger” presents these three philosophers’ views on the role of art in revealing truth. Wood shows that each philosopher understands art as allowing us to tune into what is concealed by that which particular things reveal. Finally, Susan Haack’s “Truth and Progress in the Sciences: An Innocent Realist Perspective” addresses truth in science, articulating how her Innocent Realist metaphysics and Critical Common-sensist epistemology answer traditional questions about observation and theory, kinds and explanation, truth, and scientific progress. (Haack discusses her metaphysics and epistemology elsewhere.)

The remaining three essays address constraints on attaining true beliefs. Sean Kelly’s “On Time and Truth” presents what he calls the Problem of Motion Perception. All motion takes some time to occur, but we experience objects as moving in the present and the present seems to be a singular moment. How can we experience something that occurs over an interval as occurring at what seems to be a moment? Augustine’s answer, that time is nothing more than our experience of it,

makes all our temporal experiences false. Insofar as my experience represents … that the lecture has gone on too long [or] that the kiss was too brief, … I have thereby gotten the objective facts wrong… . because neither of them has any duration at all (169).

Kelly focuses on two approaches that do not render false many beliefs about our experiences (such as the belief that the kiss lasted too long). The first is the method of retention, among the advocates of which Kelly lists Locke, Hume, Kant, and Husserl; the second, the doctrine of the specious present, among the advocates of which he lists James, Broad, and Dainton. Kelly defends Husserl’s retention theory, according to which we experience objects as moving now by retaining (but not reproducing) our past experience of the object as just-having-been at a different location.

In “The Prevalence of Truth”, Daniel Dahlstrom tries to remove the air of paradox from Heidegger’s view that “‘the prevalence of truth’ … demands nothing less than the concealment of being” (187). Being unfamilar with Heidegger’s terminology, I found this essay difficult. Dahlstrom’s central idea seems to be that, when properly understood, Heidegger means that “the particular presence or even every presence of an entity … never exhausts what it means for an entity to be” because the entity’s being is always “a matter of timing and spacing, a weave of presence and absence” (194). So far as I understand it, this amounts to the observation that the conceptual knowledge we can acquire about objects does not exhaust the truths about those objects, such as the ways in which they can be manipulated as tools. Dahlstrom calls this Heidegger’s “singular insight”, tracing how Heidegger develops the idea. Unfortunately, Dahlstrom does not offer any reason (Heideggerian or otherwise) for thinking that Heidegger’s insight is true. The idea seems to resonate with Cusanus’ view that knowledge is conjectural. But Dahlstrom does not develop any connections, instead taking traditional accounts of truth to task for ignoring Heidegger’s insight.

In “Religion and Science, Faith and Reason: Some Pascalian Reflections”, the most original essay in this volume, Daniel Garber addresses the tension between secular science and religion. Ian Barbour’s models of conflict, independence, dialogue, and integration offer probably the most well-known tools for addressing this relation. Garber dismisses Barbour’s models as superficial and irrelevant, because the "conflict between science and religion is not a doctrinal conflict" (149). In Garber’s view, the tension concerns, not science and religion, but rather "something that might be called the secular attitude and religion" (150). Garber suggests understanding this attitudinal conflict as an incompatibility among what he calls mind sets, cognitive structures that incline us toward certain kinds of beliefs and structure the way we see the world. These mind sets are not propositions, probability assignments, Kuhnian paradigms, or what R.M. Hare calls bliks. Instead, they are "the glasses through which people look at the world: they make certain facts and reasons more salient than others, and enable us to see some things and ignore others" (157). (This is, perhaps, a way of developing some of Heidegger’s ideas about the prevalence of truth.) Garber suggests that mind sets are necessary to all cognition, and he analyzes McLean v. Arkansas to illustrate his ideas. While he is pessimistic about the possibility of adjudicating conflicts between incompatible mind sets, he ends on a positive note, taking awareness of competing mind sets to foster intellectual humility.

The essays in this volume were first given as lectures in the School of Philosophy at the Catholic University of America (14). Pritzl spins the volume as a unique contribution to the defense of “objective truth as a substantial datum for philosophical reflection” against tendencies to relativize, deconstruct, or deflate truth (1). I doubt the book will do much to quell these tendencies, if only because none of the essays substantially engage with them. Many of the essays devote considerable effort to either doing the history of philosophy or surveying what others have said on some particular topic. These will be relevant to those interested in the history of philosophy about truth. Only the essays by Bix, Garber, Haack, and Kelly advance arguments that do not rely primarily upon the views of historical figures. The volume as a whole is best taken to be a resource for those keen to see how philosophers from Plato through Heidegger have engaged with truth as a “substantial and dominant reality.”3

1 See, for example, Jonathan Schaffer, “The Least Discerning and Most Promiscuous Truthmaker”, The Philosophical Quarterly 60 (2009): 307-324; Theodore Sider, “Monism and Statespace Structure”, in Being: Developments in Contemporary Metaphysics, ed. Robin Le Poidevin (New York: Cambridge UP, 2008): 129-150.

2 See, for example, Michael P. Lynch, Truth as One and Many (New York: Oxford UP, 2009).

3 I thank Andrew Cling and Eric Carter for very helpful comments on earlier drafts of this review.