Truth, Thought, Reason: Essays on Frege

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Tyler Burge, Truth, Thought, Reason: Essays on Frege, Oxford University Press, 2005, 432pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199278547.

Reviewed by Michael Beaney, University of York


This book collects together all the papers that Tyler Burge has published on Frege to date, together with a substantial (68-page) introduction and postscripts to four of the papers. Following the introduction and a short (5-page) Handbook entry on Frege dating from 1991, the book is divided into three parts. Part I is entitled 'Truth, Structure, and Method', and contains Burge's long (50-page) paper, 'Frege on Truth' (1986), together with a 20-page postscript, his earlier 6-page summary of that paper, 'The Concept of Truth in Frege's Program' (1984), and 'Frege and the Hierarchy' (1979), together with a 44-page postscript (over three times longer than the original paper). Part II is entitled 'Sense and Cognitive Value' and contains Burge's two classic papers on sense, 'Sinning Against Frege' (1979) and 'Frege on Sense and Linguistic Meaning' (1990), together with a short (2-page) postscript to the former. Part III is entitled 'Rationalism' and contains 'Frege on Extensions of Concepts, From 1884 to 1903' (1984), 'Frege on Knowing the Third Realm' (1992), 'Frege on Knowing the Foundation' (1998), and 'Frege on Apriority' (2000), together with another short (2-page) postscript to the latter. The new material amounts to around 140 pages, and I shall focus here on this, and more specifically, on the long introduction, which gives a fine overview of Burge's work on Frege. After some initial comments on Frege and 'analytic philosophy', the introduction is itself divided into three parts corresponding to the main division of the book.

Burge opens his introduction with the claim that Frege was the twentieth century's "most important and influential philosopher" (p.1). This may be controversial, but there is no doubt that without Frege, there may well have been no Wittgenstein, and the work of Russell, Carnap, and many subsequent philosophers would have been essentially different. Burge denies, however, that Frege was an 'analytic philosopher': "'Analytic philosophy' is a term quite appropriate to the work of Frege's positivist successors, but it is at best misleading as applied to Frege's own work" (p.6). He notes that the term is now used so broadly as to be almost uninformative, but writes that "in its early applications the phrase had solid descriptive aspects", suggesting, first, "a central concern with meaning cut off from metaphysics or 'reality'", second, "an approach to philosophy through a method of analysis", and third, "the prominence of analytic truths among philosophical results" (ibid.). Burge is right that Frege was not concerned with "meaning cut off from metaphysics", i.e., solely with 'linguistic meaning', but then neither were Moore or Russell in the early phase of analytic philosophy. Burge accepts a broad sense in which Frege's method is analytic, but denies that Frege was concerned with linguistic analysis. Again, this is right, but neither, too, were Moore and Russell in their early work. So these two points do not show that Frege was not an 'analytic philosopher' in the sense that Moore and Russell were; they simply show that Burge has inadequately characterized analytic philosophy. On the third point, Burge is also right that Frege did not think that the results of philosophy are mainly analytic truths, and certainly not analytic truths in the modern sense (as true in virtue of meaning). Here one might go further than Burge, though. For Frege only had a concept of analytic truth at the time of the Grundlagen. After 1884, Frege never again talks of arithmetical truths as analytic. In describing his project in the Grundgesetze, for example, he talks of seeking to demonstrate that arithmetic is 'reducible' to logic, not that it consists of analytic a priori truths. My suspicion is that he recognized the problematic nature of analytic truth, bound up as it was with his doubts about the status of principles such as Axiom V, and quietly dropped the notion. However, I do not think that Frege's views on analyticity are enough to disqualify him from counting as an 'analytic philosopher' in the sense that Moore and Russell ­-- and particularly Russell -- count as analytic philosophers. Burge has not provided a convincing characterization of analytic philosophy. (Ironically, in a footnote a few pages later, Burge criticizes Dummett for characterizing analytic philosophy in such a way as to exclude both Frege and Russell. He notes there -- correctly, in my view -- that the analytic tradition is "better characterized historically, and by reference to a loose sharing of methods and approaches" (p.14, fn.7). But Burge does not provide any account of this, although material for such an account can be gleaned from his book as a whole.)

The issue is not just a matter of terminology, since the extent to which Frege can be read as a contemporary analytic philosopher, and in particular, as a modern philosopher of language, has been a central question in the interpretation of Frege's philosophy ever since Dummett's pioneering book on Frege, tendentiously called Frege: Philosophy of Language. Many of Burge's ideas have clearly been formed in opposition to Dummett's views, particularly on the issue of Frege's conception of sense, which I will turn to shortly. But Dummett is also a target in Burge's papers on Frege's conception of truth, collected and supplemented in Part I. In particular, Burge argues that Dummett's criticism of Frege for assimilating sentences to names by treating both as denoting objects is mistaken. For in Frege's logic, it is not the sentence 'Snow is white', for example, that denotes a truth-value but the nominalization 'Snow's being white', the corresponding sentence in Frege's logic then being 'Snow's being white is the True', 'is the True' here translating Frege's horizontal sign (cf. pp.21-2, 111-15). Sentences are thus still understood as involving predication, even if the only predicate is 'is the True'. Burge nevertheless denies that the content of ordinary sentences such as 'Snow is white' is correctly represented in this way, since "attributions of truth represent a cognitive step beyond the mere use of object-level sentences" (p.25). Frege's mistake rests not on assimilating sentences to names, according to Burge, but on "taking truth-values to be the topics or subject matter of all propositional representation" (ibid.).

Understanding the way in which commitments to truth are implicated in our practices of assertion and judgement is clearly of central importance in evaluating Frege's philosophy. Burge's previously published papers have contributed a great deal to this understanding, and he elaborates further on this in the two long postscripts that are included in Part I, one to 'Frege on Truth' (pp.133-52) and the other to 'Frege and the Hierarchy' (pp.167-210). In the first, he elucidates the non-modal, formal character of Frege's conception of truth and logical consequence, and criticizes the conclusions drawn from this by Thomas Ricketts in 'Logic and Truth in Frege' (Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supp. Vol. 70, 1996), and in particular, Ricketts' claim that Frege lacked a semantics. In the second, he elaborates on his views about Frege's commitment to a hierarchy of senses, and responds to criticisms that Christopher Peacocke made in 'Entitlement, Self-Knowledge, and Conceptual Redeployment' (Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Vol. 96, 1996). Burge here defends the postulation of a hierarchy, arguing that once

one focuses not on linguistic meaning but on thought expressed and attributed by language--and one thinks of thought content as perspective on or way of thinking about a subject matter … the hierarchy is far from the bugbear that most philosophers have presented it as being. (p.199)

Part II is the shortest part of the book, containing just two papers, 'Sinning Against Frege', with a 2-page postscript, and 'Frege on Sense and Linguistic Meaning'. But the corresponding part of the introduction is the longest, and it is clear that Burge sees these papers as his most important. He describes the first as marking "the beginning of an expanding realization of how markedly Frege's conception of sense differs from common conceptions of linguistic meaning in modern philosophy of language" (p.37), and the second as "philosophically the most significant of my Frege papers" (p.57). These two papers are well known, and in my view provide a convincing antidote to the anachronistic reading of Frege fostered by Dummett. I will merely highlight here what Burge himself describes as "philosophically the most important discovery that I have made in working on Frege" (ibid.). This is the appreciation of the significance of what Burge calls Frege's conception of sense as idealized cognitive value. It is not just that such a conception reveals how different Frege's approach is from that of many modern philosophers of language, who seek to ground meaning in the actual patterns of linguistic use by an individual or community. More positively, it reveals a conception that is integrated into a theory of thought and knowledge that respects the role that norms of reason play in determining sense (cf. pp.56-7). In his logicist project, Frege saw himself as explicating the senses of number terms, senses that had been expressed all along by mathematicians even though they had not been fully grasped prior to Frege's own work. Frege's actual explication may have turned out to be defective, Burge notes, but this should not detract from the significance of the underlying view. In fact, Burge writes:

the view corresponds to something deep about the nature of thoughts. In both the history of natural science and the history of mathematics, there is a strong pull to attributing a conception to individuals who get on to the basic features of a subject matter, even though they have not fully mastered the conception. The example of Newton on limit is one such case. The examples of Newton on mass or (mathematical) function, Leibniz or Descartes on inertia, Dalton on atom, Mendel on gene, Abaelard or Bolzano on logical consequence, are others. (p.56)

As Burge goes on to remark, such a view is important because of the support it provides for anti-individualism -- according to which, as he puts it, "the nature and the individuation of certain mental states … necessarily involves the relations between the individuals in those states and aspects of an environment which is the subject matter of those states" (p.57). It is here that one can see, in particular, how Burge's interest in Frege connects with his other work in the philosophy of mind and language, and why he regards Frege as so important for contemporary debate. Argument is clearly needed to link anti-individualism about sense (on Burge's Fregean construal) and anti-individualism about mental states, and questions also arise about what it is to attribute a conception to someone that they may only express rather than fully grasp. But on this latter point, what I find attractive about the Fregean position Burge advocates is that it provides room for historical understanding. Indeed, it seems that such understanding is required both in making sense of and in justifying the attribution, say, of a conception of limit to Newton, by showing how the development of such a conception led to present views. Burge talks of Frege's own "historical perspective on the development of logic and mathematics", which "gave him concrete illustrations of incomplete understanding" so that he "could rightly regard his development of logic as the clarification of incompletely understood logical concepts and structures" (p.63). Without historical understanding, then, Frege's project itself cannot be either understood or evaluated.

The norms of reason that play a role in determining sense and thought thus have both an historical and a logical/linguistic dimension (cf. p.64), and Burge illustrates this further in Part III of his book, focusing on what he calls Frege's rationalism. Here understanding Frege does indeed require locating Frege's views in the broader historical context, and in the papers reprinted here, Burge sheds much light on such topics as Frege's conceptions of self-evidence and apriority. Perhaps his views on Frege's Platonism have been the most controversial, and I had a sense in reading the introduction that this aspect of his interpretation of Frege was being played down slightly (see e.g. p.65). But whether that is true or not, I did find that the Platonist elements of Frege's philosophy made more sense in the context of Burge's overall reading of Frege. In fact, in general I would say that collecting all his papers on Frege together in the way that he has (with their organization into three parts), and introducing them with a detailed explanation of their interconnections, his own motivation in writing them and the evolution of his work as a whole, demonstrates just what an impressively coherent and detailed account of Frege Burge has developed over the last twenty-five years.

In his introduction Burge admits that "In some cases the essays are more difficult to read than Frege's own work" (p.11). The long postscript to 'Frege and the Hierarchy' is a good illustration of this. But Burge also expresses the hope that "patient, slow reading, will find them forthright and clear" and that "in combination with more direct reflection on Frege, they will yield philosophical insight and stimulation in the reader" (ibid.). Slow reading is certainly necessary, and for those who are unfamiliar with Burge's work on Frege or Frege's philosophy itself, it is not a book to read cover to cover. The introduction provides an excellent overview of Burge's views, and the two classic essays in Part II would be the next things to read. For those already familiar with Burge's papers and the various interpretive debates, Burge's postscript to 'Frege on Truth' makes a useful contribution to the ongoing discussion about Frege's conception of logic. But throughout the essays there are insights into the interconnections between the elements of Frege's philosophy and into the philosophical issues themselves, and all of them repay the close attention that Burge recommends.

In the preface to his book, Burge speaks of the change in his approach to the study of Frege that came from the realization that Frege's rationalism had a deeper influence on his conception of sense than had previously been appreciated. This altered his view of the value of exploring the history of philosophy: "Studying Frege became not merely an exercise in intellectual hygiene and development. It became a means of philosophical discovery" (p.vii; cf. p.10). In this respect the book bears comparison to Dummett's pioneering work, Frege: Philosophy of Language. There are essays on different topics, each of which contributes to contemporary debate. Unlike Dummett's book, however, it is far more sensitive to Frege's actual motivations and to the broader historical context. Dummett's book may have dominated discussion of Frege and relevant topics in the philosophy of language and mind for twenty-five years. Burge's book will provide an essential point of reference for the next twenty-five years.