Truth Without Objectivity

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Kolbel, Max, Truth Without Objectivity, Routledge, 2002, 165pp, $30.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415272459.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


Kölbel’s book is a swashbuckling attempt to defend the initially implausible view that there is a semantically respectable notion of relativized truth. Indeed, on one reading of his view, he seems to be arguing that that the concept of relativized truth can be thought of as a conceptual building block in terms of which we can understand the more commonly employed concept of objective truth.

After a preliminary discussion of truth-conditional semantics, Kölbel introduces in Chapter 2 one of the main themes of the book, the idea that we should guard against an “excessive objectivity” in our conception of truth. He relies heavily on examples to generate the need to move beyond objective truth. Specifically, he asks the reader to consider the following statements:

1) Licorice is tasty
2) Popocatépetl will probably erupt within ten years.
3) Cheating on one’s spouse is bad.

While 1) through 3) look like genuine assertions, statements that we can think of as true or false, Kölbel argues that they are importantly different from other sorts of statements that have truth value. In particular, he argues that a person A can believe each of these statements, while another person B rejects each of these statements, while neither A nor B has made a mistake. You can think that licorice is tasty while I think it is not tasty and we don’t suppose that one of us must be in error. Of course, if the claim I make about licorice has an objective truth value, and you are denying the very claim that I make, then it wouldn’t make sense to suppose that neither of us has made a mistake. At least it wouldn’t make sense if we understand mistaken belief in the most natural way—belief that is false. The moral to draw, Kölbel argues, is that there is a concept of truth that is not objective—there is a perfectly respectable concept of relativized truth. Generalizing from these examples, Kölbel offers the following preliminary characterization of objective truth:

For any p it is objectively true or false that p just if: for all thinkers A and B: it is a priori that if A believes p and B believes that not-p then either A has made a mistake or B has made a mistake. (p. 31)

Since Kölbel thinks that the claim that licorice is tasty is not objectively true or false in the above sense, but he does think it has a truth value, he thinks we need a concept of relativized truth—we need to introduce the concept of p’s being true relative to a perspective. Believers occupy perspectives and A’s belief that licorice is tasty can be true relative to A’s perspective S1 but not-true relative to R’s perspective S2.

You probably would very much like a better idea of what a perspective is, but you’re not going to get one from Kölbel. He gives us the bad news on p. 101 when he acknowledges, “I will not be able to explicitly define the concept of perspective possession … .” Nevertheless, he argues, one can still attach sense to the concept in terms of the explanatory role it plays within the theory. We do, after all, need an explanation of the datum (difference of belief without error) and we can view the introduction of perspectives as a “postulate” whose justification is the explanatory work it does. In this respect, Kölbel argues, his perspectives are no different from the theoretical entities introduced in physics (p. 103). I’ll have more to say about the plausibility of this way of introducing perspectives later.

Kölbel is well aware that many of his readers will think that his solution to the alleged puzzle concerning assertions of the form “Licorice is tasty” is a bit drastic given the availability of alternative approaches. In Chapters 3 and 4, he considers what he calls the revisionist and the expressivist alternatives. The philosophers Kölbel calls revisionists would, no doubt, prefer to be called reductionists. They take assertions of the form “Licorice is tasty” to be elliptical for indexical assertions. “Licorice is tasty,” said by me, might just mean, for example, “I like the taste of licorice.” Your “rejection” of my view on licorice is just your way of stating that you don’t like the taste of licorice. We now see how there can be “disagreement” (something like what Stevenson called disagreement in attitude) without error. Similar sorts of reductions have, of course, been proposed for probability claims and ethical statements (Kölbel’s other candidates for relativized truth).

The objections Kölbel offers to reductionism are brief to say the least. He simply argues that if we look at discourse concerning taste, for example, it is not unusual to encounter conversations of the following sort:

You: Licorice is tasty
Me: No, you’re wrong about that.

If the reductionist were correct, the conversation would be decidedly odd. Your statement would be equivalent to “I like licorice” and my statement would be most naturally construed as claiming that you have made some sort of introspective error.

Expressivism (noncognitivism) gets a more careful treatment and his primary objection to the view seems to center around Geach’s concern that we seem to have no difficulty employing aesthetic and ethical statements as premises in arguments that we view as valid. It is difficult even to make sense of validity when we are dealing with premises/conclusions that lack truth value.

The book closes with an attempt to survey and respond to some of the main criticisms that have been leveled at relativistic views of truth.


It seems to me that Kölbel’s rejection of reductionism/revisionism really are too quick. Consider the following familiar sort of conversation:

She: I love you
He: Me too.

To be sure, the literal interpretation of the conversation might suggest that he is simply expressing a kind of narcissism in associating himself with his lover’s love of himself. Of course, we all know that in this context the “me too” is an indication of his willingness to utter a sentence token of the same type, a token that will assert his own love of her. Similarly, if the reductionist were correct, it wouldn’t be all that surprising if we adopt similar conventions for contexts in which one person says “Licorice is tasty/I like licorice” and the other person, wanting to indicate conveniently disagreement in attitude, says simply “I disagree”—meaning only to indicate that he wouldn’t put forth a sentence token of that type (a token that would indicate that he also liked licorice). I’m not arguing here that the reductionist will win the day—I’m arguing only that it would be a mistake to take the surface grammar of our sentences about taste too seriously or straightforwardly in trying to uncover the underlying meaning of such statements.

If Kölbel’s argument were successful against the reductionist, I worry that a similar sort of argument would be equally effective against his own relativist account of truth. On one interpretation of Kölbel’s view, he is claiming that we are at least implicitly aware of the fact that we are employing a relativistic understanding of truth with respect to the evaluation of assertions about taste, ethics, probability, etc. Why else would we be hesitant to assert that when you say “Licorice is tasty” and I say “It’s not” one of us has made an error? But now imagine the following conversation:

You: Licorice is tasty
Me: I couldn’t disagree more—What you said is so untrue.

On Kölbel’s view, I should realize that it makes no sense to evaluate your statement as true or false simpliciter—that’s why we don’t have to think that one of us has made a mistake. But then I should recognize that in all likelihood your statement that licorice is tasty is true relative to your perspective. Indeed, that’s how I should think it most natural to evaluate your statement in terms of truth or falsehood. But then with what precisely am I disagreeing? I shouldn’t be saying or thinking that your statement is false simpliciter. I shouldn’t even think it appropriate to evaluate your statement that way—it doesn’t have objective truth or falsehood. But if I evaluate it the way it should be evaluated according to Kölbel, I should in fact agree that what you said is true relative to your perspective. Indeed there is no real disagreement between you and me since I can quite consistently think that it is objectively true that your statement is true relative to your perspective, while I also think that it is objectively true that my statement is true relative to my perspective.

An analogy might be helpful. There are, of course, all sorts of relative concepts. I can truly say of a pygmy that he is tall (relative to the class of pygmies) while you can simultaneously truly assert that he is very short for a prospective NBA power forward. You and I are in no sense disagreeing about anything. It is not that there is no objective truth about whether the pygmy is tall or short. There is an objective truth about whether he is tall relative to one class of people and short relative to another. But truth relative to a perspective, if we can make sense of that notion, is presumably like height relative to a reference class. When you say that it is true (relative to your perspective) that licorice is tasty, and I say that it isn’t true (relative to my perspective), you and I are no more disagreeing in this case than we were in the case of the pygmy. It is not that we should be struck by the fact that there is disagreement without error. It is rather that there is simply no disagreement.

Though I’m personally rather sympathetic to the redcuctionist approach to most of the problematic assertions that concern Kölbel, I think that the expressivist also has resources to defend expressivism against Kölbel’s objections. When we think about deductive validity, we think in terms of the form or structure of arguments and we don’t focus much on the content of the statements that comprise the premises and conclusions of those arguments. It is an uncontroversial fact that even if expressivism were true, the sentences that the expressivist regards as neither true nor false have the syntactic structure of sentences that make assertions. In the context of evaluating an argument, it wouldn’t be surprising, I think, that we would simply not worry much about the fact that certain sentences are problematic bearers of truth value in characterizing a given argument containing sentences of that type as deductively valid.

Let me conclude by commenting briefly on the idea that we can rest content as philosophers with introducing the critical notion of perspective as that which plays a certain explanatory role. Consider again an analogy. Suppose a philosopher excitedly suggests that he has finally found the elusive fourth condition that when added to justified true belief will give one an account of knowledge that is immune to Gettier counterexamples. Somewhat skeptical, we ask for more information and we are told that in addition to a belief’s being true and justified it must have the property of being Gettier-shielded. We wonder what that property is and are told that it is the property (whatever it is) that makes justified true beliefs immune to Gettier counterexamples. In response to our disappointment, the philosopher assures us that the property of being Gettier-shielded is a theoretical posit whose philosophical utility is to be measured by the explanatory work it does—and what wonderful work the posit does! We all feel that there is a distinction between the justified true beliefs that are also knowledge and the justified true beliefs that are not, so we could surely use a property that would account for the difference. Now I trust no-one would think that our excited epistemologist has made any genuine philosophical progress in getting a handle on Gettier counterexamples.

In the same way, I’m inclined to think that Kölbel hasn’t given us anything we can hang our philosophical hats on when he introduces perspectives as theoretical “posits” the justification for which consists in the explanatory work they do. In the case of theoretical entities posited by physicists, first there is typically an array of properties attributed to these entities, and second, the explanatory work they are supposed to do is typically causal. Their existence and nature is supposed to causally explain phenomena we think need a causal explanation. But perspectives aren’t causally explaining anything. They are introduced as essential elements in the development of a philosophical theory, a theory we must understand before we can evaluate it. Without some sort of positive story about what a perspective is, I’m somewhat at a loss as to how to even think about the relation of being true relative to a perspective.

Kölbel’s book is clear, original, and stimulating. While I wasn’t convinced (I don’t think many will be), it is a refreshingly straightforward attempt to advance a relativism that will, at the very least, require the reader to think more carefully about how to approach in a different way the data Kölbel seeks to illuminate.