Truthmakers: The Contemporary Debate

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Helen Beebee and Julian Dodd (eds.), Truthmakers: The Contemporary Debate, Oxford University Press, 2005, 186pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199283567.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


The papers in this collection all revolve around the fundamental metaphysical question of whether truths require truthmakers. Versions of most of the papers were written for a conference at the University of Manchester, though two were written expressly for the book. The topic is, of course, important and any philosopher interested in the nature of truth would do well to read the papers collected here.

I think that it is fair to suggest that the philosophical figure who dominates most of the discussion in these papers is David Armstrong. Although he has his defenders in the book, most of the authors target some aspect of Armstrong's views for criticism. Armstrong takes it to be fairly obvious that most true propositions are made true by some feature of a world that exists independently of the way it is represented. In their clear and useful introduction to the book, Helen Beebee and Julian Dodd formulate the unrestricted version of Armstrong's principle as follows: Necessarily, if a proposition P is true then there exists at least one entity X such that the proposition that X exists entails P. Notice that the principle talks about the existence of X entailing the truth of P. Properly speaking, the truthmaker is X but because on most views truthmakers are themselves neither true nor false, we can't straightforwardly speak of X's entailing P. So to say something about the truthmaking relation in terms of entailment we need to come up with a proposition asserting the existence of X. While probably harmless for some purposes, it is worth underscoring that the truthmaking relation as traditionally conceived by, for example, correspondence theorists of truth is not a relation of entailment. Nor is it obvious that one can properly understand it or analyze it in terms of a relation of entailment. Indeed, for all the discussion of truthmakers and the truthmaking relation by the authors of these papers, there is very little discussion of the critical question of how one might understand truthmaking except in terms of principles about entailment between propositions. And I think that is unfortunate. If truthmaking is unanalyzable it is understandable that not much is said by way of analyzing it. But that it is unanalyzable is itself an important conclusion.

It is also interesting to me that most (though not all) of the authors want to talk about truthmakers without worrying too much about truthbearers. Again, I'm not sure that's a good idea. To put my cards on the table, I am entirely sympathetic with Armstrong's fundamental approach to the issue of truth. But I don't think one can get clear about truthmakers without getting clear about the nature of truthbearers. The fundamental reason that one needs truthmakers is that the correspondence theory of truth is correct. And a defense of the correspondence theory of truth is a package deal. One needs to develop and defend an account of truthbearers, truthmakers, and the critical relation of correspondence that holds between the two if one is going to defend the kind of picture that grips Armstrong.

It is difficult to review a collection. Rather than try to summarize and critically evaluate individual papers, I'll comment instead on a number of particular themes that emerge in some of the papers. It will be a bit of a scattergun approach, but I hope it will give the reader a feel for the discussion in the book. My discussion will also tend to be critical. That's what philosophers tend to do. The reader shouldn't infer from an emphasis on the negative that the papers were anything other than of uniformally high quality. I learned a great deal from reading them.

Let me begin with a very general methodological observation. As I indicated, these papers deal with one of the most fundamental of metaphysical issues. One of the more frustrating aspects of the debate is that one can read people who purport to be disagreeing with Armstrong, but who obviously want to acknowledge the almost trivial character of some of what he says. So virtually everyone wants to agree that if it is true that the rose is red, then it will be so because (in some sense of "because") the rose is red. The truth/falsehood of the sentence/thought/assertion/proposition will depend on the way the world is, specifically the way the rose is. Alternatively, one might use the nominalization of a sentence and acknowledge that the truth of the proposition that the rose is red depends on the rose's being a certain way. But is a way that the rose is a truthmaker? Some seem to think that the critical question is whether we are going to embrace the way a thing is as an entity (see, for example, Jennifer Hornsby's suggestion in "Truth Without Truthmaking Entities" that we shouldn't think of the use of nominalizations as carrying "heavy" ontological commitment, pp. 46-57). But try as I might I couldn't find in the discussions any clear, satisfying criteria for determining what counts as an entity. If there are truthmakers they will be something like states of affairs or facts. Are facts entities? Is a way that the world is an entity? I wouldn't touch the question with a ten-foot pole unless I knew precisely how it has been loaded. Does it depend, as Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra suggests (in "Why Truthmakers?," p. 23), on whether we can "count, and quantify over" such ways? That's fine with me, but people who don't want the ways things are to be entities will surely refuse to quantify over them, and will "count" them only derivatively as they count the corresponding truths. How many ways are such that the rose is every one of those ways? A lot. But, the deflationist will argue, that only means that there are a lot of true things one can say about roses. Ontologically, one doesn't need to commit oneself to the existence of anything over and above the rose and truths about the rose (See Melia's "Truthmaking with Truthmakers" p. 81). Quine's criterion for ontological commitment never really helps us settle any fundamental ontological controversies. If you have good arguments for universals or states of affairs you'll quantify over them. If you reject the existence of universals or states of affairs, you'll find some way to avoid quantifying over them -- you'll come up with paraphrases that proliferate uses of ontologically "harmless" predicate expressions.

Most all of the participants in the debate over truthmakers try to weaken the truthmaking principle (and with it, perhaps, the correspondence theory of truth) by arguing that we clearly need to restrict the principle. We don't need truthmakers in the form of states of affairs or facts for certain true attributions of essential properties, negative existential claims, or necessary truths. It was surprising to me that there was so much agreement on this topic. Consider the modal truths first. I suppose the idea is that if a is essentially F, then the existence of a by itself is enough to make true the proposition that a is F. Moreover, necessarily true propositions are, of course, entailed by all propositions, so it would be trivially true that the existence of any randomly selected object would entail a necessary truth. But all this just underscores a point made earlier. We are not getting at an understanding of truthmakers or correspondence between truthbearers and truthmakers through principles concerning entailment. I have no idea what ontological de re necessity is (where such necessity can't be successfully reduced to de dicto necessity), but whatever is supposed to make it true that a is necessarily F it is surely not the mere existence of a. Similarly, whatever makes it true that the interior angles of a triangle add up to 180 degrees is not Caesar's having crossed the Rubicon. Again, the moral to draw is not that there aren't truthmakers for such de re and de dicto necessities -- it's only that we can't capture talk of truthmakers in the way attempted by most of the authors in the anthology.

Apparently most of the philosophers contributing to this collection are particularly worried about positing truthmakers for negative existentials. Most seem to agree that there is something paradoxical about suggesting that it is the existence of something that makes it true that there are no unicorns. But again, if there are truthmakers they are almost certainly going to be something like states of affairs or facts, and I don't see why someone who thinks that there are such things is going to get all bent out of shape about there being such states of affairs or facts as nothing having the property of being a unicorn, or the property of being a unicorn being unexemplified.

Chris Daly ("So Where's the Explanation?") seems to suggest that it is a mark against truthmakers and the correspondence theory of truth that requires them, that it is so easy to come up with truthmakers. Indeed, he seems to suggest that it is a reductio of the correspondence theory of truth that even its rival theories would succumb easily and trivially to the search for truthmakers. The coherence theorist of truth agrees, after all, that a proposition P is true in virtue of coherence between P and other propositions believed. But as soon as they admit that then we have found a truthmaker for P. The truthmaker is the fact that the relation of coherence holds between the belief that P and some person's or group's other beliefs. The pragmatist who goes on about truth being a function of what ideal inquirers will ultimately accept has also inadvertently stumbled upon a truthmaker for P. The truthmaker is this fact about what ideal observers would believe. So I gather the criticism is supposed to be that Armstrong's correspondence theory of truth replete with its truthmakers is vacuous. It fails to distinguish itself from any other view of truth. But this seems to me an odd sort of criticism. To be sure, philosophers have always walked a fine line between saying things that are trivially true and saying things that are obviously false. That's the price you pay for engaging in investigation that is supposed to yield necessary truths. People who think that the correspondence theory of truth is true don't think that it just happens to be true as a matter of contingent fact. They think that it is necessarily true, that no other theory of truth could possibly be true. And it's hard for me to see why I should worry about the fact that alleged alternatives to the correspondence theory are actually implicitly committed to the very conception of truth they are attacking. I think what Daly has inadvertently shown is simply that pragmatists and coherence theorists are most plausibly construed as closet correspondence theorists with odd (and obviously false) views about the contents of, and truthmakers for, various sorts of propositions.

In my introductory comments I complained about the relative lack of discussion of truthbearers in an attempt to get clear about truthmakers and correspondence. In his paper ("Realism Beyond Correspondence") Michael Morris complains that the correspondence theory of truth leads to a kind of implausible idealism. The idea is that the robust realist is committed to the view that there is a reality that exists independently of the way it is represented. But to make plausible a correspondence theory, Morris argues, its proponent will have to argue that language and reality have similar sorts of structure. And this will be plausible only if either reality has a structure that determines the structure of language, or language has a structure that determines the structure of reality. Morris seems to argue that the former is implausible because if that were the way of things it should be possible for reality to have a structure that was independent of the structure of sentences. And in that case it should be in principle possible to "characterize" that propositional structure of reality in ways that do not "depend essentially on reference to the structure of sentences" (p. 52). That no one can do, and so we are left with the anti-realist's position that it is the structure of language that somehow determines the nature/structure of reality.

The argument is, at best, suspect. In general, one ought to be suspicious of someone who concludes that if the structure of reality is independent of representation that we ought to be able to represent that structure without relying on representation. In any event, most of the historically prominent correspondence theorists never thought that the primary bearers of truth value are sentences, and that the structure of sentences must correspond somehow to the structure of facts. If one takes the primary bearers of truth value to be something like thoughts, it is surely much more plausible to suppose that thought latches on to a structure that reality has independent of that thought.

Marian David's contribution to the collection ("Armstrong on Truthmaking") is one that does emphasize the importance of thinking carefully about truthbearers in evaluating the kind of correspondence theory of truth that requires truthmakers. In criticizing Armstrong's view, he points out that Armstrong wants the correspondence between thoughts/representations and truthmakers to be an internal relation, i.e. a relation that necessarily obtains given the existence of the relata. He then points out a tension in Armstrong's naturalistic account of representation and his thesis concerning the relata of this internal relation. Put crudely David's idea is that for Armstrong belief states don't have their content essentially. Therefore it seems possible that a belief state and its truthmaker in this world, can exist in some other world in which the relation of correspondence fails to hold. Once again David's discussion brings to the fore the critical importance of analyzing the nature of truthbearers, truthmakers, and correspondence in any critical evaluation of the question of whether there are such things as truthmakers.

To evaluate David's specific objection to Armstrong, we would need to settle some thorny issues of interpretation concerning Armstrong's philosophy of mind. If Armstrong identifies belief tokens with brain states (as David suggests) and identifies their content with their functional role, then it is indeed unclear how he can take correspondence to be an internal relation between token beliefs/representations and the states of affairs that are their truthmakers. But a clear-thinking functionalist should surely worry about identifying beliefs (types or tokens) with brain states. The property of believing that P just is a functional property. It is the property of being in a state that plays a causal role. A brain state might "realize" the functional property, but that just means that a brain state might take the value of the variable in the complex predicate that picks out the functional property. Properly speaking, belief states are not brain states, and the identity conditions for belief states are inseparable from the causal roles that determine their content (according to the functionalist). In any event, whatever Armstrong thinks, thought/belief is neither a brain state nor a functional state. The most plausible correspondence theories of truth will take correspondence to be an internal relation between truthbearers and truthmakers. That view may require a somewhat mysterious (Putnam called it magical) view of both thought and its correspondence to the world. But one of the most common mistakes a philosopher can make is to attempt an analysis of the unanalyzable.

Clever deflationists will always be able to find ways of "translating" talk about truthmakers into talk about unanalyzed truth. It is difficult to come up with an argument for truthmakers that doesn't already presuppose a fairly elaborate metaphysical framework. I certainly don't think that one is going to get very far persuading anyone of the need for truthmakers by linking their posit with objections to phenomenalism and behaviorism as David Liggins does in "Truthmakers and Explanation." It's not that one can't legitimately complain that the contingent subjunctives needed by both phenomenalists and behaviorists need a categorical ground, but deflationists can easily capture that thought by arguing that the relevant subjunctives can't be true unless there are non-subjunctive truths lawfully connected to the truths describing correlations among sensations/behaviors. Nor do I think we will get very far thinking about truthmakers in the context of difficult issues in the philosophy of time and the question of whether there are truthmakers for propositions about the future or so-called tenseless propositions (a topic explored by Josh Parsons in "Truthmakers, the Past and the Future"). The presuppositions of arguments for or against truthmakers should ideally be less controversial than the existence of truthmakers.

For a similar reason, I can't get myself to worry too much about Fraser MacBride's argument against states of affairs (in "Lewis's Animadversions on the Truthmaker Principle"). MacBride claims that states of affairs offend against the Humean principle that there can be no necessary connections between distinct states of affairs. The state of affairs of a's being F is distinct from both a and F -- a can exist without the state of affairs a's being F and so can F. If Hume didn't recognize that there can be complex wholes that require the existence of their parts but are not simply identical with the set or sum of their parts, he should have. Anyone interested in defending states of affairs is going to junk the version of the principle that MacBride attributes to Hume.

So how are we going to persuade someone who isn't already convinced that there are truthmakers in the form of states of affairs or facts? Returning to a theme running throughout my comments, it seems to me that the most straightforward way of introducing truthmakers into one's philosophical picture is to start by thinking about truthbearers. To adopt an Armstrongian tone, the following seems patently obvious. Without representations of reality there would be no truthbearers. We can argue about what makes something a representation of reality, but we had better analyze representations in such a way that they are distinct from that which is represented. In our search for truth, we had better leave room for falsehood. If it is obvious that a representation is distinct from that which is represented, it is equally obvious that the accuracy/correctness/truth of a representation depends on whether things are the way they are represented. I don't care whether you call the world's being the way it is represented an entity. It is, nevertheless, a truthmaker. You can try to be a deflationist with respect to representation, but it's a lot harder than being a deflationist with respect to truth. And when deflationism with respect to representation fails, that which is represented by an accurate representation will be staring you in the face as the obvious candidate for a truthmaker.