Turning East: Contemporary Philosophers and the Ancient Christian Faith

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Rico Vitz (ed.), Turning East: Contemporary Philosophers and the Ancient Christian Faith, St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 2012, 365pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780881414158.

Reviewed by Christoph Schneider, Institute for Orthodox Christian Studies, Cambridge


The book consists of sixteen essays mainly by American philosophers who converted to Eastern Orthodoxy. Most of them give an account of why they were dissatisfied with their original ecclesiastical or secular background and what made them join the Orthodox Church. Some of the contributions focus on the personal and biographical reasons for conversion; others give more space to theological and philosophical arguments. Most authors follow a middle way and create a narrative in which the personal and the intellectual aspects of their spiritual journey are closely intertwined. Philosophy is thus understood in the ancient way as love of wisdom, as a way of life, and not just as an academic discipline that some intellectually gifted people choose to earn their living. The reader is invited into the past and present lives of genuine truth seekers who felt the need for a religious and philosophical reorientation that in some cases occurred relatively late in life and at the height of their academic careers.

As regards the intellectual and philosophical aspects of their conversion, the contributors provide very different reasons for why they found their place in the Orthodox tradition. They also hold diverging views of how the relationship between faith and reason, theology and philosophy, is to be thought of. Given that all of the chapters are written by professional philosophers, one would at times expect some more substantial reflections, and some more subtle arguments for why Christian Orthodoxy can give better answers to the problems discussed in contemporary philosophy and theology than any other tradition. Yet this shortcoming can to a large extent be explained by the fact that an Orthodox philosophy of religion that critically and creatively relates to the major strands of contemporary Western thought is still very much a project for the future. Many contributors provide lucid and well-informed overviews of the chief problems in modernity and post-modernity. But the way the Orthodox faith is presented as the solution to these problems does not always match the intellectual level of the preceding analysis.

It is also surprising that nineteenth- and twentieth-century Russian religious philosophy is only rarely referred to in order to clarify the relationship between Orthodoxy and Western philosophy. Due to their sophisticated engagement with modern philosophy and the sciences, one would expect the works of thinkers such as Vladimir Solovyov, Sergius Bulgakov, Pavel Florensky, Semyon Frank, and Mikhail Bakhtin to figure more prominently in the book.

But such generalisations cannot do justice to the wide variety of different views expressed in Turning East. It is therefore best to look at some of the contributions in more detail. Regarding the relationship between faith and reason, the essays fall between two poles. On the one hand there is Richard Swinburne, one of the most distinguished contributors to this volume, who sees a connection between his notion of natural theology and Orthodox theology. Theism is viewed as "the best justified metaphysical theory" (p. 58), and he believes "that there are sound (probabilistic) arguments for the existence of God and for the truth of the doctrines of the Christian religion" (p. 57). The "Christian theological system" thus turns out to be a "superscientific theory" (p. 54). Swinburne gives mainly doctrinal and pastoral reasons for his conversion from Anglicanism to Eastern Orthodoxy. Apart from a short reference to Gregory of Nyssa and John of Damascus, the reader is left in the dark as to why there should be a particular affinity between Swinburne's interpretation of metaphysical theism and the Orthodox tradition. Nor does it become clear how "substance dualism" could be defended within the theological framework of Eastern Orthodoxy (p. 68).

There are other authors who take the opposite stance on the question of faith and reason. Richard Otte, for instance, seems to advocate a nature-grace dualism that tends towards a separation between faith and reason. He points out that the realm of natural science is restricted "to situations in which God and other supernatural agents do not affect our world". Consequently, the "actions of supernatural agents do not fall within the domain of science, and thus nothing in science is violated when supernatural agents act in our world" (p. 111). These statements entail the view that there is a neutral, autonomous realm of nature that exists independently of divine grace. But such a theory is hardly compatible with a genuinely Orthodox metaphysics, which excludes any dichotomy between nature and grace.[1] Although it is necessary to distinguish between different modes of divine presence, grace is always already at work in creation, so that no human theorizing about reality can abstract from the divine archÄ“ and telos of any object of investigation.[2]

The inevitable correlate of Otte's notion of autonomous nature/reason is his tendency towards a fideistic understanding of faith. On his view, conversion is in the first place a matter of the heart and not of the mind. Indeed, in Greek patristic thought the heart (kardia) is an anthropological key term. But it is not, as Otte argues, the seat of affections and emotions as opposed to the mind and reason (see p. 112). There is no particular connection between the heart and emotions. Rather, the heart, in patristic theology, is the entire person at its deepest level and comprises not only emotions, but also reason, intelligence, and desire.[3] Otte rightly emphasizes that conversion is not just an intellectual matter, but that it also affects the emotional and affective part of the personality. But it by no means concerns human affections and desires more than reason and intelligence. Conversion as a change of the human heart is a change of a human being in its entirety.

However, most authors try to avoid Swinburne's and Otte's extreme -- but diametrically opposed -- positions and conceive of the relationship between faith and reason, theology and philosophy, in a more balanced way. Kelly Dean Jolley, for example, finds in Orthodoxy an understanding of Christian faith that is a complete education, Bildung and paideia, and which entails a physical and a metaphysical dimension (pp. 123-4). Jeffrey Bishop's essay not only explains how liturgical practice can fulfil and 'consummate' philosophy in general, but also shows how liturgy and liturgical theology enabled him to find answers to his own specific philosophical questions. Bishop writes about his prolonged critical reflection on the nature of space and time in dialogue with thinkers such as Foucault, MacIntyre, and Heidegger. He comes to the conclusion that only divine presence, liturgically mediated, "saves communal space from becoming the space of control and governance" (Foucault); and that only God, who transcends time, "saves history from becoming the fleeting memory of Romantics, who construct pasts that perhaps never were" (MacIntyre) (p. 363). In Bishop's contribution, his personal narrative and philosophical reflections indeed form a seamless whole.

A number of authors criticize the Enlightenment belief in a universal, timeless, and contextless reason, as well as the post-modern conviction that we are faced with a plurality of different traditions and rationalities that are irreconcilable and antagonistically related to each other. Whereas this Enlightenment belief tends to sublate faith into speculative reason, the post-modern conviction results in a new form of scepticism, and in metaphysical, epistemic, and moral relativism.

H. Tristram Engelhardt gives an elaborate account of this philosophical impasse and stresses that "without being able in principle to reference an unconditioned knower, one loses a standpoint from which one can even in principle envisage setting aside moral pluralism and the plurality of narratives regarding the nature of reality" (p. 230). Without noetic knowledge and reference to a transcendent God, he argues, we can only know reality as it is construed within our specific socio-historical circumstances, but not as it is in itself. For Engelhardt, the way out of this cul-de-sac, the way to the truth, can only be achieved by "rightly-directed prayer" (p. 233). The question is whether his critique of a merely immanent and finite philosophy that claims to be absolutely normative for all human knowledge does not lead to too negative a view of philosophy and its role in religious discourse. There are a number of remarks that point in this direction. His former overconfidence in reason, which he embraced while being a member of the Roman Catholic Church, seems to have given way to abjectness. What is missing to some extent is an account of how Orthodox faith reconfigures philosophical thought-categories, how rationality, human reason and philosophy are utterly transformed and redeemed by the experience of grace.

To be sure, Engelhardt only questions the legitimacy of philosophy insofar as it is an expression of immanentism, finitism, and human self-enclosure. But in his essay there are nonetheless tendencies to posit an opposition between reason, philosophy, and metaphysics on the one hand, and the experiential, existential, and even miraculous character of Orthodox spirituality on the other. The only real argument he provides (in this essay) for why Orthodoxy is superior to Roman Catholicism and secularism is that Orthodoxy avoids intellectualism, i.e., it does not absolutize autonomous human reason. After his sophisticated critique of what went wrong in the Western history of ideas, one would expect an equally sophisticated explanation for why Orthodoxy is the answer to the questions occidental philosophy and theology could never answer satisfactorily. But this expectation is never met. Instead of arguments he  presents stories about religious experiences and personal encounters. These experiences, we are told, were so compelling that he simply had to join the Orthodox Church. In other words, there is an obvious shift from a philosophical to a personal-existential narrative, and the tension between these two types of discourses is never really resolved. No real attempt is made to give an outline of an Orthodox metaphysics, a metaphysics that indeed avoids both extremes, overconfidence in reason as well as complete lack of confidence in the powers of thought.[4]

There are a number of other reasons the authors give to explain their decision to become Orthodox that keep reoccurring throughout the book. For instance, one quite often comes across the well-known argument that the Orthodox Church is the only Church that has preserved the original faith of the Apostles. David Bradshaw tells us that his conversion to Orthodoxy coincided with the insight that in the Orthodox Church beliefs and practices of the Church of the Apostles "had remained continually existing until the present day" (p. 26).

Mark J. Cherry seeks to overcome relativism by resorting to a rather dogmatic and uncritical notion of the unchangeability of the Orthodox tradition. "Traditional Christianity", he claims, "is anti-historical in affirming that the truth it reveals is not fashioned by the social and cultural forces of a particular time or place, intellectual fashion, or national aspiration. There can be no development of doctrine. Orthodox Christianity is the one truth faith, rightly worshipping the one true God" (p. 341-2). Although Cherry is right that Christian faith excludes metaphysical or moral relativism, it is nonetheless the case that a properly Christian, i.e., a Christological and Trinitarian understanding of truth, allows for synchronic plurality and diachronic change. The eternal and infinite is always mediated by the temporal and finite, and manifestations of the one truth are always culture- and context-specific. The great Russian theologian Sergius Bulgakov, for instance, would not have agreed with Cherry that traditional Christianity and Orthodoxy are anti-historical and that they exclude the possibility of development of doctrine. [5]


Turning East gives an excellent overview of why Western intellectuals join the Orthodox Church. But one gets the impression that many of the converts are not as critical towards their newly chosen Church as they are regarding their previous denomination. It is indeed striking that almost none of the contributors has anything critical to say about the present state of the Orthodox Church or Orthodox theology. But, perhaps, the Orthodox faith the contributors are trying to live is a kind of Orthodoxy that -- knowingly or unknowingly -- they have always already combined with the best elements of the Western world they inhabit. For some authors, as they themselves admit, the relationship between philosophy and Orthodox theology has not yet been satisfactorily clarified -- a fact that did not hinder them from converting to the Orthodox Church. But who could claim to have final answers to a question of this complexity?

[1] "The Eastern tradition knows nothing of 'pure nature' to which grace is added as a supernatural gift. For it, there is no natural or 'normal' state, since grace is implied in the act of creation itself." Vladimir Lossky, The Mystical Theology of the Eastern Church, Cambridge, London: James Clark and Co. Ltd, 1991, p. 101. With respect to the question of miracles see Maximus the Confessor, Ambiguum 42 (PG91:1344A-C).

[2] Roy Clouser, The Myth of Religious NeutralityAn Essay on the Hidden Role of Religious Belief in Theories, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005 (rev. ed.).

[3] See the excellent paper by Prof David Bradshaw, On Drawing the Mind into the Heart: Psychic Wholeness in the Greek Patristic Tradition [accessed 14/9/2013].

[4] For a good example of such a middle way see Pavel A. Florensky, The Pillar and Ground of the Truth: An Essay in Orthodox Theodicy in Twelve Letters, Boris Jakim (tr.), Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press, 1997.

[5] See Sergius Bulgakov, The Orthodox Church, St. Vladimir's Seminary Press: Crestwood, New York, 1988, pp. 26-35. "The historical development of the Church consists in a realization of its super-historic content; it is, so to say, a translation of the language of eternity into that of human history, a translation which -- notwithstanding the unchangeableness of its content -- nevertheless reflects the peculiarities of a given epoch and language; it is a varying form, more or less adequate, for an invariable content. In this sense it is possible to speak of dogmatic development, and just on this account it is equally impossible to speak of stagnation or immobility in the consciousness of the Church" (p. 31).