Twentieth Century French Philosophy: Key Themes and Thinkers

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Alan D. Schrift, Twentieth Century French Philosophy: Key Themes and Thinkers, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 320pp., $30.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405132183.

Reviewed by Eric Matthews, University of Aberdeen


Schrift offers an unusual and original perspective on the development of French philosophy in the twentieth century, by which he means, not "a unified tradition that shares certain philosophical assumptions" (p.2), but simply "a historical unfolding of philosophical discourse that took place in the French language in the twentieth century".  There is, indeed, in his opinion no such thing as a uniquely "French" philosophy, if that means a unified tradition of the kind just referred to.  What gives twentieth century French philosophy such unity as it has is rather "the empirical fact that the figures discussed below … did their philosophical work in the French language and were engaged with and informed by the institutional practices of the French academic world" (p.2).  It is above all, Schrift has come to believe, these institutional practices which are responsible for some of the characteristic features of French philosophy in this period.  He goes so far as to say (p.188) that "It is impossible to understand the evolution of French philosophy in the twentieth century without understanding some of the unique aspects of French academic culture".

This approach determines the whole structure and contents of the work.  The book proper starts with a "Chronology", starting in 1200 and ending in 1999, listing events of philosophical or academic significance, but also such other important historical events as the French Revolution of 1789, the Franco-Prussian War, the opening of the Paris Metro, Pablo Picasso's completion of Les Demoiselles d'Avignon, the German Occupation of Paris in 1940, and so on (these examples are chosen at random).  There then follows "Part I", a relatively short and condensed survey of the main stages in the development of philosophy in twentieth-century France (covering such schools as positivism, idealism, phenomenology, existentialism, structuralism and post-structuralism, along with their various subdivisions and derivatives).  "Part II" provides an alphabetically-organised collection of brief biographies of many figures in modern French philosophy.  This is remarkably comprehensive, including not only better-known names like Aron, Bachelard, Barthes, de Beauvoir, Bergson, Brunschvicg, Chartier ("Alain"), Deleuze, Derrida, Foucault, Lacan, Lévi-Strauss, Lyotard, Maritain, Merleau-Ponty, Sartre and Weil; but also a host of other figures who may be less well-known, especially to English-speaking readers.

"Appendix 1", which follows, is in many ways, despite its position, the heart of the book, for it is here that Schrift describes, in some detail and with great understanding, the peculiar institutional framework of French academic life in general, and of academic philosophy in particular, which he claims to be crucial to understanding how French philosophy has developed in the last century. First comes an account of the history and interaction of the three most influential institutions of higher education and research, the Sorbonne, the Grands Écoles, and the Collège de France, including details of such things as the modes of student entrance (where relevant), the place of philosophy in the institution, how students gain qualifications there, and how graduates with these qualifications find employment in the educational and other systems of France. There are also accounts of other relevant institutions, like the Institut de France, the Centre National de Recherche Scientifique (and its precursors) and the Académie Française.  The career-structure of academic philosophers is outlined, beginning with teaching for the baccalauréat in lycées, and then, for those judged to be most worthy of promotion, moving into teaching in universities or Grands Écoles in one of the various grades of university teaching, perhaps even becoming a Professeur.  Recent, or relatively recent, changes in this career-structure and in the routes for obtaining a doctorate are clearly outlined. "Appendix 2" consists in an equally thorough and comprehensive bibliography of works of French philosophers in English translation.  The book ends with a list of works consulted and an index.

The value of this book is certainly not as an introduction to twentieth-century French philosophy for those with little or no previous knowledge of it.  The review of the developments in actual philosophical ideas and arguments in Part 1 is much too brief and cursory to help such readers.  As a consequence, moreover, the way in which these ideas and arguments are described is such that it could only make much sense to someone already reasonably familiar with the field.  For example, Brunschvicg's version of idealism is distinguished from Kant's by the fact that "Brunschvicg does not understand the objects of our knowledge to be constituted on the basis of a priori and unchanging categories; instead, the objects of our knowledge unfold historically as the mind reflects on its own activity" (p.11).  This sentence could mean much only to someone who had read Brunschvicg's own account of what that historical unfolding amounts to.  Or, to take another example more or less at random, no one could really understand what was meant by saying that

This methodological privileging of structure -- the underlying rules or "general laws" -- over event -- the act of articulating the myth -- leads structuralism to place emphasis on synchronic relations rather than diachronic developments (p.53)

without some prior acquaintance with structuralist writings.  The role of Part 1, then (and this is not in itself a criticism, just a statement of obvious fact) is plainly not to provide this kind of understanding of the development of French philosophy in the last century.

Where the book does have enormous, and virtually unique, value, however, is as a rich scholarly resource for those who do already have some acquaintance with the texts, placing these texts and their authors, and the whole activity of philosophising which they embody, in their cultural and institutional context.  Anyone who wants to know about the intellectual and professional life of virtually any twentieth-century French philosopher whose works they read cannot fail to find what they want in the "Brief lives" section.  Those seeking to track down the works of these authors which have been translated into English are sure to find the bibliography useful.  And anyone who wants to know such things as what the relation is between the Sorbonne and the Collège de France, or what is the importance of the agrégation de philosophie, or what is the equivalent in British or American universities of a Maître de conférences, or what the khâgne is, will find these questions answered very clearly in Appendix 1.  Schrift has produced a work of very thorough scholarship for which all English-speaking students of French philosophy will be grateful.

What is not so clear, however, is whether, or at least how far, Schrift's central claim is correct.  He says that "it is impossible to understand the evolution of French philosophy in the twentieth century without understanding some of the unique aspects of French academic culture" (p.188), where "academic culture" seems to mean mainly the institutional framework of academic life in France.  But the examples that he gives of ways in which French philosophy is affected by the culture, in this sense, seem to me to be rather superficial.  He mentions, for instance, "the supposed faddishness" (p.x) that some people see as characteristic of French philosophy -- that is, the way in which one intellectual fashion, such as an interest in Husserl or Hegel, is rapidly followed by another, in which Nietzsche is favoured.  This may well be, as he says, explained by the "highly centralized and regulated system of academic instruction and professional certification" in France. But such a succession of fashions is hardly peculiar to French philosophy, although it may be more frequent in the recent French tradition than it is elsewhere, and it does not seem to be crucial to the understanding of French (or any other) philosophy as philosophy, as opposed to as a social phenomenon.  Secondly, Schrift refers to the "cult" with which many of the leading French philosophers have been surrounded, or have even surrounded themselves, "with the result that the interlocutors with whom they are engaged and the teachers from whom they learned are often completely eclipsed from view" (p.xi).  Again, to the extent that this is true, it is an interesting fact about French life in general, but it does not seem relevant to understanding the content of those philosophers' ideas and arguments.  It may well be, as Schrift says, that too much attention to the glamour of these cult figures may be a distraction from the more important philosophical activity going on in quieter academic circles, but that is surely not the same as saying that an understanding of academic structures is necessary to a proper grasp of the evolution of French philosophy.  Finally, Schrift mentions the intense relationships between many of the leading French philosophers engendered by their following of the same educational and career paths.  This is certainly important to an understanding of the nature of French intellectual life, but again does not seem to shed much light on the development of philosophy as such.

The best way to understand French, or any other, philosophy seems to me to be to follow the arguments which philosophers put forward in defence of their own views and in criticism of others.  Which others they attend to may well be affected by the nature of their own philosophical formation, and so an awareness of that philosophical formation may help in understanding why they are interested in certain themes rather than others.  But, that said, the way in which they develop those themes, by reflection and argument, is what counts in understanding their philosophy as philosophy.  In that regard, French philosophers are no different from those of any other nation.  What is distinctive about French philosophy, if anything is, is the role which it plays in French culture more generally, and that is shaped by the nature of French society since the 1789 Revolution, and the conflict between secular republicanism and a more authoritarian conservatism.  The institutions of French education reflect that conflict, in which most of the time secular republicanism has been triumphant, and that certainly influences the style and the themes of much French philosophical writing and thinking.  Schrift's book provides an invaluable guide to this cultural role of French philosophy in the twentieth century, but it does not really shed much light on the internal development of philosophical thought in France.