Tychomancy: Inferring Probability from Causal Structure

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Michael Strevens, Tychomancy: Inferring Probability from Causal Structure, Harvard University Press, 2013, 265pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674073111.

Reviewed by Colin Howson, University of Toronto


The point of departure of Michael Strevens's book is the fact that people seem able to predict statistical distributions over evolved states of dynamical systems whose individual outcomes are highly sensitive to initial conditions -- systems like roulette wheels, tossed coins, drawings from urns, shuffled cards and, more exotically, molecular velocities -- and to do so independently of any statistical data or experimentation. The question naturally arises of where this faculty comes from. This book is Strevens's answer to the question. It advances the hypothesis that people -- some better than others -- are equipped with some basic inferential techniques enabling them to integrate probabilistic and dynamic considerations into an overall explanatory scheme that is, to a high degree of approximation, empirically vindicated.

Strevens subsumes these techniques under the rubric of 'rules of equidynamic reasoning' What are these rules? One is what he calls the microdynamic rule; then there is the equilibrium rule and the uniformity rule. These themselves subdivide: we encounter microconstancy (defined below), microlinearity, independence and so on. We are also told that the probabilities that engage with the dynamics in the various cases considered are single-case physical probabilities which are i.i.d.: independent and identically distributed. Motivating Strevens's account is the example of Maxwell's derivation of his celebrated probability distribution over molecular velocities in a gas, in which Strevens discerns equidynamic reasoning par excellence. But one doesn't have to be a physicist of Maxwell's calibre to confidently infer probabilities in much simpler systems following a cursory inspection. Strevens claims that the ability is nothing less than universal, present even in small children and evident, he argues in a later chapter, in the various informal probabilistic considerations in The Origin of Species: Darwin, says Strevens, is "clever in the same way" as children (p. 133).

Strevens's book is engaging, written with considerable verve, and full of interesting details and insights. Unfortunately, it also suffers from serious flaws that could have been avoided by a more self-critical approach. First, he does not seem to me to give a wholly satisfactory answer to the question he poses at the outset, since the suite of rules which make up equidynamic reasoning seems far too complex to be at the recall of ordinary people, let alone ordinary infants. Consider his discussion of his first example, the red and black coloured wheel of fortune. Why, he asks, should it persistently yield a probability of red of one half. The answer, he tells us, "lies in a rather abstract property of the wheel's dynamics . . . what I call the wheel's evolution function" (this maps the values of the initial conditions to the outcomes 'red' and 'black'). He continues: "The evolution function has a property that I call microconstancy" (each small interval of the spin-speed variable's range contains 1/2 red-producing values; the proportion he calls the wheel's strike ratio). This implies that any smooth initial distribution over the phase-space will generate the 1/2 probabilities of red and black (p. 57); smoothness, he tells us, he used to call 'macroperiodicity', but from this point on he will call it 'microequiprobability' (p. 58). He then tells us that if a "process is microconstant with respect to an outcome e, then the initial condition distribution will induce a physical probability for e approximately equal to the strike ratio for e." (p. 59). He offers no proof of that conclusion (I shall return to the absence of proofs shortly), but more importantly it does not seem to be what people do when they look at a wheel of fortune, satisfy themselves that it is evenly balanced, and then declare that it will deliver a red outcome with a probability close to one half.

Strevens concedes that there is what looks like a plausible, and certainly simpler, alternative hypothesis to his which might seem to be readily to hand, namely that people note that (i) the outcomes of a wheel of fortune depend sensitively on the initial angular velocity combined with the frictional force, and (ii) the wheel's construction, and its partitioned outcome-space, seem to possess relevant symmetries (p. 64). While (i) is certainly true, (ii) raises the question of which symmetries actually are relevant, and here intuition can be misleading: Jaynes (2003, Chapter 10) points out that displacing the centre of gravity of a flipped coin along its axis has no effect, surprisingly, on the frequency of heads). There is also the question of how these symmetries combine with the dynamics to yield the observed probabilities. Strevens claims that his own equidynamic theory supplies the answer, supporting the claim by citing what he calls 'shaking' processes (e.g., bouncing coins, dice-rolls and urn-drawings) as requiring for their analysis his equilibrium rule: through a long enough evolution, which will depend on the precise structure of the process, these systems take random walks through their available phase-points leaving them asymptotically independent of initial position. But appealing to the asymptotic behaviour of extended random walks hardly seems to be the stuff of intuitive reasoning either, though Strevens denies this. Nor does any halfway rigorous argument accompany this claim: instead Strevens refers to an earlier work of his invoking an ergodic Markov chain theorem, not further described (pp. 100-105).

This brings me to a more general criticism of the book: despite its bold claims to provide answers to difficult questions it contains almost nothing in the way of proof, a deficiency not satisfactorily remedied by references to other work of his wherein, Strevens tells us, such proofs are to be found (references to his own work abound in this book, even on one occasion to a manuscript). Strevens pretty much concedes the absence of formal rigour -- at one point late in the book he concedes that his earlier identification of proportional phase-space volume with probability is merely sketched (p. 159). A diagram supposedly illustrating his equidynamic analysis of a spinning coin comes (with acknowledgment) from a paper by Joseph Keller (1986), who solves the (highly simplified) equations of motion of a tossed coin of negligible width rotating about a horizontal axis and landing without bouncing. But Keller's discussion explains, while Strevens's does not, why the pre-image regions of 'heads' and 'tails' in the two-dimensional phase-space are bounded by the hyperbolas pictured in the diagram. Keller extends his analysis to a wheel of fortune under a constant frictional torque, and, for both coin and wheel, shows that for any continuous probability density over the initial velocities the limiting probability is the required uniform one: ½ for 'heads', (2π)-1 for the final position of the wheel. No such proof is given by Strevens. In its absence, it seems to me open to question whether Strevens's insistence that 'microdynamic reasoning' delivers these results is strictly justified.

Strevens's habit of referring the reader back to earlier work by himself for proofs of important claims is, I think, both presumptuous and short-changes the reader: anyone seriously interested in the questions Strevens raises and claims to answer in this book is entitled to a higher standard of demonstration -- as, if not Strevens himself, then Harvard's referees should have appreciated. Indeed, it is not at all clear what sort of audience this book is aimed at: a minimally technically-accomplished reader will be frustrated by the largely formula and proof-free nature of the book, while a lay audience will very likely find the dense verbal explanations difficult to follow. An obvious compromise would have been to go for simpler explanations helped along by some simple mathematics (where possible), supplemented by technical appendices for those who would like a more formal reassurance (there is just one such appendix in this book, taking up half of one page, on Maxwell's velocity distribution).

Which brings me to my second major criticism of this book. Those familiar with the history of modern physics will recognise in Strevens's neologism-rich account both the so-called 'method of arbitrary functions' (showing that an initial distribution washes out under suitably repeated operations -- e.g., spinning a wheel of fortune or flipping a coin) -- and appropriate bits of ergodic theory. The method of arbitrary functions was introduced into the analysis of simple random mechanisms by Poincaré, and further extended by Borel, Fréchet, von Smoluchowski, Reichenbach, Hopf and, more recently, Keller, Engel, Diaconis and others. Strevens mentions a few of these people, incidentally adding himself to the list, but only to say in an end-note to his chapter:

That the one half probability of red is somehow explained by the wheel of fortune's microconstancy and strike ratio for red of one half, or by a related property, has been observed by many writers, often under the rubric "the method of arbitrary functions". (p. 232n3)

'Somehow explained' is hardly an accurate, and certainly not a fair, description of what Jeremy Butterfield has rightly called a "venerable tradition" in mathematical physics (2011, p. 1085). Be that as it may, apart from borrowing (with acknowledgment) a symmetry argument from Engels (1999) and the diagram from Keller, that is pretty much as far as his acknowledgment of that impressive body of work goes.

Strevens has an informal argument for the asymptotic independence of two systems characterised by a joint probability distribution over their initial conditions, but characteristically refers the reader back to his earlier work for a rigorous proof. He does not mention the fact that in the 1930s Hopf had proved a similar result and stated the important condition -- statistical regularity -- of its validity (Hopf, who employed both the method of arbitrary functions and ergodic theory, also showed that two initially correlated ergodic systems will display another type of asymptotic independence, mixing). Nor, closer to the present time, despite borrowing Keller's diagram, does Strevens make any other reference to Keller's paper, a classic treatment which later contributors, like Engels and Diaconis et al. (2007) built on and extended, with sometimes surprising results (the second-mentioned authors show, for example, that the conservation of angular momentum implies that a flipped coin caught in the hand is biased even in the infinite limit of velocities, except in the measure-zero case where the angular momentum vector points exactly along the coin's axis of rotation -- the Keller flip).

This failure to reference properly the remarkably rich research tradition that was inaugurated with Poincaré's proofs of the asymptotic one-half probability of red for a symmetrical roulette wheel and the uniform distribution of the minor planets, and which has enlisted in its progress some of the most distinguished names in twentieth-century mathematics and physics, is not good enough, and the referees should have picked up on the fact. It also puts in an interesting context for the following passage from Strevens's book:

Equidynamics plays a major part in science, but it gets no credit. Scientists think equidynamically, but without, it seems, full awareness of their train of thought. They do not see clearly which aspects of a system -- symmetries, smoothness, sensitivity -- support their reasoning; nor do they see clearly what kind of reasoning it is. (p. 219)

There is an irony too in this dismissive remark, suggesting as it does that Strevens's own analysis offers a significant advance on the work of the authors listed above. But all we are told by Strevens on that score, with the typical reference to his own work, is "I explain the differences between my own and others' versions of the approach in Strevens (2003, section 2.A) and from a more metaphysical point of view in Strevens (2011)" (p. 232n3). Unfortunately, the absence of any rigorous proof leaves it open to the reader of this book to question whether Strevens has genuinely advanced the discussion.

Moreover, even allowing for their informal character, the quality of Strevens's own arguments is rather variable. Consider his argument supporting his claim that the probabilities under investigation are necessarily physical probabilities, which are independent and identically distributed. We are told that infants will view drawings of red and white balls from an urn "as though they ascribe a Bernoulli distribution to ball-drawings" (p.38; he actually claims that drawing five balls exemplifies such a distribution which, of course, without replacement it does not). And they do indeed have the Bernoulli property, Strevens claims, because separate trials are causally independent (p. 210). But causal independence does not imply probabilistic independence. As Bruno de Finetti pointed out, causal independence is modelled probabilistically by the weaker condition of exchangeability (invariance under finite permutations), which permits probabilistic dependence in the way his celebrated exchangeability theorem implies: conditional probabilities are reinforced around observed frequencies (de Finetti passes unmentioned by Strevens). And Strevens hardly advances his case by claiming that, faced with drawings from a box containing red and black balls, we believe that BBBB is as probable as BBBR (p. 54). Add a few more Bs before the R and we can see that this is nonsense: we would think, for reasons that a simple Bayesian analysis makes clear, that a B is more likely than an R to follow a string of Bs, however physically symmetric the set up might appear (as I noted above, symmetry can be an equivocal guide).

The book is not improved by Strevens's idiosyncratic terminology and a sloppiness and inaccuracy in his employment of standard technical language. For example, we are told that the image of one such region under a mapping from a space of contiguous regions is itself "contiguous" (p. 98). We also seem to be told that the measurement of a physical quantity, e.g., its velocity, is effected by a random variable (p. 68). The confusion is hardly lessened by an endnote telling us that measurement "in the philosopher`s sense can be thought of as the composition of the random variable mapping the quantity`s possible values to some set of numbers such as the reals, and a measure on those numbers (on the reals, usually the Lebesgue measure)" (p. 233n11).

Despite these critical observations, Strevens's book is far from being without merit. It contains a multiplicity of informative and often novel observations. The chapter on Maxwell's derivation(s) of his famous velocity distribution is a nice piece of intellectual detective work, and the later chapters on Darwin, and on error and noise, contain some illuminating insights.


Butterfield, J. 2011. 'Less is different: reduction and emergence reconciled', Foundations of Physics, 41, 1065-1135.

Diaconis, P., Holmes, S, and Montgomery, R. 2007. 'Dynamical bias in the coin toss', SIAM Review, 49, 211-235.

Engels, E. M. R. A. 1992. A Road to Randomness in Physical Systems, Berlin: Springer.

Jaynes, E. T. 2003. Probability Theory: The Logic of Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Keller, J. 1986. 'The Probability of Heads', American Mathematical Monthly, 93, 191-197.