Types and Tokens: On Abstract Objects

Placeholder book cover

Linda Wetzel, Types and Tokens: On Abstract Objects, MIT Press, 2009, 180pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262013017.

Reviewed by Stephen Kearns, Florida State University



In her short book, Types and Tokens, Linda Wetzel defends the thesis that types exist. Wetzel’s main argument for the existence of types may be summarized as follows. We refer to and quantify over types in many different areas (in everyday life, in linguistics, in physics, etc.). Furthermore, at least some of the claims we make when referring to or quantifying over types are true. This is sufficient for the existence of types. Therefore, types exist. She then counters some nominalist responses to this argument (that, for example, such apparent reference to types is merely a façon de parler) and ends with the beginnings of a positive theory of types and their relation to tokens.

What does Wetzel mean by “types”? She introduces types by means of examples. Consider the fact that the grizzly bear numbers fewer than 1,000 and its US range is Montana, Wyoming and Idaho. As Wetzel points out, no particular bear has this property. It is, instead, a type of bear that does. By way of elucidating their nature, Wetzel claims that types are universals, and the tokens of these types instantiate these universals. Thus particular bears (tokens of the type) instantiate the type bear.

Wetzel thinks reference to and quantification over types is ubiquitous. Indeed, it is hard to argue with her. I am a nominalist, but even in getting clear on my position it is natural to talk of types. Thus when explaining my position I may point out that, though there are different types of nominalism (class nominalism, resemblance nominalism, ostrich nominalism, etc.), I’m not just any old type (as it happens, I’m an ostrich nominalist). But if there are different types of nominalism, there are types. Thus in expressing my nominalism, I am committed to its negation. Hoist with my own petard! This is to bring home just how natural and common type-talk is. Wetzel spends the entire first chapter doing the same, painstakingly setting out examples from linguistics, biology, physics and other areas, in which experts in their fields refer to and quantify over types. As Wetzel says, "talk of types is thoroughly ensconced in ordinary and scientific language and theory" (p3, italics original).

Wetzel presents her data as an unanswerable challenge to the nominalist. The only way of responding to this challenge that Wetzel thinks has any hope is to show that sentences that refer and quantify over types can be paraphrased by sentences that do not refer or quantify over types. In Chapters 3 and 4, the author considers various possible paraphrases of a sentence of the form “Type T has property P”. These include (where “Ts” should be understood as denoting the tokens of the type T): “All Ts have P”, “Most Ts have P”, “Normal Ts have P” and “Ts have P”. Wetzel convincingly argues that none of these forms capture the same truth conditions as the form of sentence that the nominalist aims to paraphrase. To summarize Wetzel’s complaint against the first of these paraphrases (“All Ts have P”), it is often the case that a type has a certain property (e.g. the grizzly bear is brown) even when it is not the case that all tokens of this type have this property (it is not true that all grizzly bears are brown). Wetzel is particularly acute at producing such counterexamples when discussing the types and tokens of language (she goes to impressive lengths, for instance, to show that tokens of the letter ‘A’ have very little uniquely in common with each other aside from being tokens of that type). Even if one of these paraphrases succeeds, Wetzel believes the frequent quantification over types in many other common sentences still shows the nominalist project to be untenable. The unavoidability of type-talk, and its use in apparently true sentences, grounds Wetzel’s argument for the existence of types.

In Chapters 2 and 5, Wetzel examines the common claim that nominalism is epistemically better placed than realism. In Chapter 2, she considers the objection to realism that types, being abstract objects, are epistemically inaccessible to us. One simple version of this objection says that we can know about an entity only if we can be causally related to this entity. Wetzel objects that such a principle will rule out a priori knowledge and that, should the principle be weakened appropriately, knowledge of types can be easily accommodated (thus, perhaps we can come to know types by being appropriately causally related to their tokens). In Chapter 5, Wetzel goes on the offensive, claiming (rather dramatically) that nominalism has a “dark and ugly side” that negates any epistemic advantage that it may be thought to have over realism (p93). The crux of Wetzel’s argument, which she presents in reply to Quine and Goodman’s classic exposition of nominalism, is this. If sentence types do not exist, then the only sentences that do exist are particular tokens. However, it is a truth of syntax that if “P” and “Q” are sentences, then “P and Q” is a sentence. A nominalist finds herself having to deny this if there happens not to be a token of the sentence “P and Q”. In what Wetzel calls a “desperate measure”, Quine and Goodman suggest that such tokens may exist because there are (often imperceptible) spatio-temporal regions that are appropriately shaped (p101). Wetzel argues that these imperceptible tokens are as epistemically problematic as nominalists claim that types are, and thus nominalism must surrender any epistemic advantage it might be thought to have had over realism.

The last two chapters (6 and 7), set out some remarks on a positive theory of types (and, in particular, word types). The discussion in Chapter 7 does so in the light of an objection to realism about types. The problem is this. Following Wetzel, call the line “Macavity, Macavity, there’s no one like Macavity” (from T.S Eliot’s poem “Macavity: The Mystery Cat”) “(*)”. () contains seven words. Are these word types or word tokens? They can’t be types because there are only five word types present in the sentence. Nor can they be word tokens, because tokens are concrete and the sentence (and its constituents) is abstract. Wetzel responds to this objection by claiming that we should understand () to be made up in part of three occurrences of the word “Macavity”, where such occurrences are not to be understood as either the type of word or tokens of this word. This supplements Chapter 6’s proposal that a word type is "an abstract theoretical linguistic entity, one that has at least one meaning, at least one pronunciation … , may have a spelling, and has instances some of which are physical objects/events" (p114).

How persuasive is Wetzel’s case for the existence of types? We should agree with her that people at least attempt to refer and quantify over types very often. I am also pessimistic of finding a nominalistic paraphrase of sentences of the form “Type T has property P” along the lines of those Wetzel considers. However, there are other strategies available to the nominalist that Wetzel does not discuss. One such strategy ties in with a motivation one might have for becoming a nominalist in the first place.

If types exist at all, it seems likely that they have all their (interesting) properties in virtue of the properties of their tokens. Thus even if it is true that the US range of the grizzly bear is Montana, Wyoming and Idaho, the type has this property in virtue of the various properties of all the individual grizzly bears. Given this, there are truths about all the individual bears that are sufficient for the truth of the proposition about the type (given that types exist). Indeed, this will seem to hold quite generally. The truths about types are necessitated by the nominalistically-acceptable truths about tokens. (Wetzel comes close to stating this when she says “facts about species are ultimately rooted in facts about members of them — they supervene on the facts about members, if you will” (p83).) This fact (that, if types exist, truths about types are necessitated by the nominalistically-acceptable truths) makes the nominalist (another darn type term!) wonder whether the best theory of the world really does commit us to the existence of types. Imagine we can collect all the nominalistically-acceptable truths together. Call this collection “T”. The intuition nominalists rely upon is that this theory seems to capture everything there is to capture about the world. Once one has set out all the facts about each individual bear (how each one eats, behaves, looks, etc.) and also set out all the generalizations about them, going on to describe the truths about the type bear seems at the very best superfluous. The type does no work (the tokens are where the action’s at!). Of course, given that we do not (and cannot) have access to T, and that, even if we did, using T would be unwieldy, it is very useful to talk as if there are types. Sentences that do refer to or quantify over types would, strictly-speaking, be false, but they can convey information about the tokens that cannot be as easily conveyed by nominalistically acceptable alternatives (as Wetzel herself does a good job showing). Wetzel may reply that positing types makes for a simpler theory, but this is not so. T will be a proper part of any (true) theory that posits the existence of types and the existence of such types does not explain the truth of T (for all, at least, Wetzel says). What talk of types does simplify is our thinking about the world, but it unclear that this should have any impact on our ontology. I remain convinced, then, that there are promising arguments for nominalism that remain untouched by Wetzel’s discussion.

A further concern I have is with Wetzel’s confident claim that the sentence “The US range of the grizzly bear is Montana, Wyoming and Idaho” simply attributes a property to a type. If this is what the sentence is doing, then it seems that the type grizzly bear has spatial location, which seems to contradict the idea that types are abstract objects. Wetzel briefly addresses this point in an endnote, saying "one solution is to say that types can have spatio-temporal properties, without thereby having a spatio-temporal location" (p151, n2, italics original). However, it is not clear that this reply suffices. For consider the claim that the grizzly bear is located in Montana, Wyoming and Idaho. The commonsense view (which Wetzel seems to want to maintain) is that this claim is true. If in making this claim we are simply attributing a property to a type, we are claiming that the type has a spatial location, in which case it is not an abstract object. We may get the same result more directly. Intuitively, the following sentence is true: “The grizzly bear is spatio-temporally located and causally efficacious”. Equally intuitively, the following sentence is false “The grizzly bear is abstract and not concrete”. But this is the opposite of what one would expect if these sentences were merely attributing properties to the type bear, for this type is abstract and non-spatio-temporally located. In general it seems that the kinds of properties we attribute to the grizzly bear are properties that concrete and not abstract objects have.

One may also question whether Wetzel’s argument ends up proving too much. Even accepting the existence of universals, there is disagreement about whether universals are abundant or sparse. That is (roughly), does there correspond a universal to every (or almost every) meaningful predicate, or do there exist only universals that ‘cut nature at the joints’? Similarly, we may ask whether there corresponds a type to every type-like term. Wetzel’s emphasis on the fact that we seem to refer to and quantify over types in everyday language suggests that we must say that there does. This suggests that we should be committed to highly gerrymandered and artificial types. This offends many philosophers’ (not just nominalists’) sense that only natural things exist (by “natural” here, I mean something that cuts nature at the joints). It is one thing to think that “electron” refers to a type, and another entirely to think that “post-punk” does. It would have been helpful had Wetzel addressed this issue explicitly.

This book (or at least the token of it that I read!) has much to recommend it. It is clear, concise and contains many inventive and persuasive arguments. As I have said, those who deny the existence of types have more avenues to explore than Wetzel mentions (some of which I regard as highly attractive), but Wetzel does an excellent job of showing that some of the avenues a nominalist might travel down may in fact be dead-ends.