Unbecoming Subjects: Judith Butler, Moral Philosophy, and Critical Responsibility

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Annika Thiem, Unbecoming Subjects: Judith Butler, Moral Philosophy, and Critical Responsibility, Fordham University Press, 2008, 310pp., $27.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823228997.

Reviewed by Catherine Mills, University of Sydney


Annika Thiem's exploration of Judith Butler's work in the context of moral philosophy provides an insightful interpretation along with a provocative argument for a rapprochement of sorts between post-structuralism and normative philosophy on the question of ethics. Rather than repeating their supposed opposition because of moral philosophy's emphasis on problems of normativity, and post-structuralism's oft-claimed failure to address such questions, Thiem wishes to maintain a focus on normative claims while taking on the revision of subjectivity offered by Butler. She argues that Butler's recent work presents a number of productive challenges to moral philosophy, challenges which Thiem extends and fleshes out through the work of Emmanuel Levinas and Jean Laplanche, both of whom Butler also draws upon. The key claim that she makes throughout this discussion is that ethical responsibility cannot simply be thought of as a matter of response to another, but must also entail the question of responding well. Thus, questions of value are inherent to ethics but, at the same time, ethics must be predicated on a primary demand for response. Ethics, then, emerges in the tensions between living and living well. She further argues that ethics necessarily entails critique, since the future-oriented question of how to live well requires attention to the productive constraints of subject formation, along with contestation of the presuppositions entailed in ideas of the good life and justice.

The book is divided into three parts, the first dedicated to developing an interpretation of Butler's work on subject formation, the second extending her reflections on responsibility and the third articulating the role of a particular conception of critique in ethics. The engagement with Butler's work is sympathetic, perhaps overly so. The book is largely dedicated to drawing out the ways that Butler has attempted to re-theorise subjectivity and related concepts of agency, desire and will through highlighting the constitutive operations of social norms and the implications of this for ethics. While referencing much of Butler's work, Thiem engages most thoroughly with Butler's recent book, Giving an Account of Oneself, which is her most explicit theorisation of ethical responsibility to date. In this text, Butler mobilizes the work of Levinas and Laplanche (among others) to theorise responsibility as stemming from the recognition of a fundamental vulnerability in the condition of being a subject. Thiem also traces Butler's engagement with figures such as Nietzsche, Freud, Foucault and Lacan among others.

The theorisation of subject formation as shaped and produced by social norms developed from the interpretation of Butler's work in the first part of the book provides the starting point for the conception of a critical ethics that Thiem offers.

The second and third parts yield the book's most original insights. These intersect through the temporality of ethics, specifically the future-orientation of both responsibility and critique. Thiem claims that critique is important for ethics, less because it provides a "value or norm of moral conduct" than because it allows for examination of the ways in which norms and values normalize subjects and how they can also orient moral conduct (pp. 12-13). Further, critique is framed as a matter of interrogating "power in relation to [social] justice" (p. 13).

Thiem's discussion of the role of critique in ethics, which appears in the final two chapters of the book, largely consists of a rehearsal of the Foucault-Habermas debate. She suggests this debate allows us "to grasp the particularly epistemologically aporetic situation that conditions the problematic of moral normativity with which critique continually has to wrestle" (p. 205). What is at stake, in other words, is the interrelation of truth, power, and norms. Casting the exchange between Butler and Seyla Benhabib on theorisations of agency, power and critique and their relation to feminist politics as a restaging of the Foucault-Habermas disagreement, Thiem sides with Butler's formulation of the necessity of 'contingent foundations' for normative claims. Ultimately, then, critique is not a matter of debating competing normative claims, but instead, motivates an approach that sees questions of social justice as central to the ethical enterprise, where justice effectively bridges ethics and politics. In this vein, Thiem ends the book with the somewhat feeble conclusion that while ethics requires us to oppose injustice where we find it, what counts as justice cannot be determined in advance but must be negotiated in everyday encounters. But while it is questionable whether Thiem's account of critique and justice is compelling in the end, and indeed, whether the turn to social justice in ethics requires an elaborate understanding of critique at all, I want here to focus briefly on another aspect of her argument.

Central to the perceived possibility of a rapprochement between post-structuralism and moral philosophy are the variable conceptions of ethics as responsibility or accountability. (As an aside, 'post-structuralism' is figured primarily through Butler's work, but also includes Foucault and Derrida; what constitutes 'moral philosophy' is never really clear.) The notion of accountability as the standard of moral conduct is often cast as post-structuralism's bête noir: accountability, it is frequently argued, prevents rather than produces any real understanding of ethics, by, for instance, subsuming the proper nature of ethics in juridical calculation, and relying on and reiterating erroneous conceptions of individual will, agency and causality. To her credit, Thiem avoids a simplistic opposition of accountability and responsibility and aims instead to provide a way of thinking about accountability as the past-oriented dimension of ethics insofar as it allows for the attribution of past actions to a culpable agent. Accountability and responsibility are not opposed accounts of ethics per se but are, rather, two complementary dimensions of ethics differentiated by their temporal orientation where one faces to the future, the other to the past. While this provides a novel approach to accountability and responsibility, it is not entirely successful as an account of ethics.

"Accountability" refers to the capacity to give an account of or to reckon or count something, or indicates that someone can be called to give such an account or reckoning, that something is explicable and someone is answerable for that thing. "Responsibility" likewise suggests that someone is answerable to something or accountable for something; it also means being capable of fulfilling an obligation or trust. Clearly, the terms are closely related, but theories of responsibility that distinguish it from accountability -- which is calculable in some way or another -- emphasize the weight of the (incalculable) obligation to others indicated in responsibility that is not evident in accountability. Recent criticisms of theories of ethics as obligation for their juridicism notwithstanding, responsibility thus seems to offer resources for thinking ethics beyond calculability and individual intentionality and will, and emphasizes instead the socially embedded, embodied and constitutively relational aspects of ethical subjectivity.

For Butler, recognizing our vulnerability and dependence on social norms and others for our own existence as subjects reveals a constitutive opacity in subjectivity. Because of our dependency on norms and on others, we are partially obscure to ourselves, and can thus never give a full account of ourselves. While in broad terms I agree with this account of subject-formation, and agree that re-imagining subjectivity in these terms has consequences for ethics, I am not convinced that the consequences are those identified in this book. For instance, Thiem argues that the opacity of the subject to itself (and to others) renders accountability problematic because of the diminished knowledge of our acts and intentions. But partiality only renders accountability problematic if it is already assumed that accountability should be total, that in order to be effective in establishing culpability an account must make transparent all the factors and vagaries, the desires and intentions, that might inform an action. But to suggest that complete access to knowledge of oneself is required to establish culpability overburdens the notion of accountability. Further, it is not clear that such an overburdened conception of accountability is necessary to, or even important to, moral philosophy. Perhaps some specification of the ways that this notion appears in moral thought would help the argument.

But it would be unfair to suggest that Thiem rests with this. Instead, she proposes an integration of accountability and responsibility, whereby it is through practices of giving an account that the condition of unknowingness about ourselves is shared and brought to life. It is also through this necessarily partial accountability that the impacts of past actions on the present can be reworked and transformed (p. 182). In this sense, then, it is the partiality of accountability that makes responsibility possible, insofar as this partiality emerges through and maintains our dependence on others, which puts us in relation to the past and in doing so, allows a transformative relation to the future. At the same time, it is responsibility understood as the necessity of a response to another within the context of a constitutive relationality that makes giving an account possible at all. Thus, Thiem's discussion of accountability and responsibility brings out their integration and inseparability, while also admirably holding off the reduction of one to the other.