Unbelievable Errors: An Error Theory about All Normative Judgments

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Bart Streumer, Unbelievable Errors: An Error Theory about All Normative Judgments, Oxford University Press, 2017, 256 pp, $60.00, ISBN 9780198785897.

Reviewed by Robert C. Koons, University of Texas at Austin


What to say about a book whose author frankly admits that its principal claim is literally incredible? It would be churlish not to agree: the main thesis, namely, that there are no normative truths, is well beyond the pale of believability. Can such a book be of any value? Not in the ordinary way -- not, that is, because it successfully marshals convincing evidence in favor of a plausible claim. Nonetheless, the viewpoint of a philosopher is broad enough to encompass the value of paradox, antinomy, and aporia, and for that reason I can endorse the book.

Streumer supports his paradoxical conclusion in a three-step argument: (i) normative judgments are cognitive (truth-value bearing), (ii) reductive realism about normative truths is false, and (iii) non-reductive realism about normative truths is false. The three theses together entail a global error theory about normative judgments: they are all, without exception, false. This includes not only moral judgments but all normative judgments without exception, including judgments about what beliefs and inferences are justified or warranted. Streumer admits -- even insists -- that we cannot believe such an error theory, since it is impossible to believe something while simultaneously believing that there is no reason to believe it. Yet error theory about normativity entails that there is never any reason to believe anything.

So, what is the point of Streumer's book? What can we interpret him as trying to do? Streumer compares himself to Socrates, in contrast to the Sophists, since he sees himself as aiming austerely at truth rather than at the successful persuasion of his audience. However, this cannot be right, since to believe that a theory is true is simply to believe the theory, and Streumer admits that he cannot believe the theory he purports to defend. So, he cannot see himself as promoting an important but incredible truth. Streumer responds that he can at least encourage us to get as close to the truth as possible, by, perhaps, partially believing the error theory or by successively believing premises that jointly entail it. However, he can explain the value of doing these things only in terms of approaching as close as we can to the truth, and yet he cannot claim that the error theory is true, and so he cannot affirm that there is any value in approaching full belief in it.

A much better way of understanding Streumer would be to put him in the tradition of Pyrrhonian skepticism. We can take his book as propounding a puzzle or paradox, inducing a state of suspension of belief. Indeed, if we find his arguments completely convincing, we might approach the kind of total suspension that Pyrrho and Sextus Empiricus recommended to us. Ironically, it is one of the great Sophists, Gorgias, who provides the closest parallel to Streumer, since Gorgias was the author of a lost treatise purporting to prove both that nothing exists and that if anything did exist, we couldn't know it.

Personally, I find Streumer's arguments for two of his three theses convincing, namely, cognitivism and the denial of reductive realism. His arguments against non-reductive realism, although ingenious, fall well short of being compelling, especially given the absurdity of the global error theory. I highly recommend the book to readers who find non-cognitivism (including quasi-realism) or reductive realism attractive. Streumer's arguments to the contrary are both original and powerful. For reasons of time, however, I will focus here on his attempted refutation of non-reductive realism.

I note first of all that the error theory would, if true, immediately undermine Streumer's arguments against non-reductive realism. All of Streumer's arguments depend on a distinction between natural and normative properties. He excludes right from the start the sort of normative realist who denies this distinction, i.e., one who insists that all properties are at least partly normative. An Aristotelian or Thomist, for example, might insist that every genuine property has normative implications. Every member of a species ought to be a perfect member of that species, and it is good, right, and proper that such perfection be attained. Even non-Thomists might agree that, for any property F, x's having the property F entails that x ought to be (ceteris paribus) everything that an F ought to be, which is clearly a normative implication.

Streumer defines normative property in the following way (pp. 1-3).

(1) A simple normative predicate is one belonging to a stipulated list of paradigms, including 'is good', 'is bad', 'is right', 'is wrong', and 'is a reason'.

(2) A predicate is normative if and only if a sentence that applies this predicate to an object conceptually entails that this object satisfies a simple normative predicate.

(3) A property is normative if and only if it can be ascribed with a normative predicate.

Streumer could insist that the Thomist is confused in thinking that, for example, being a human being is a normative property, since the predicate 'is a human being' does not conceptually entail any normative predicate, like 'ought to have a friend'. The Thomist will insist that there is a metaphysical entailment between the two properties but this will not, by Streumer's definitions, suffice to make being human into a normative property. Thus, the notion of conceptual entailment must carry a great deal of weight. Streumer never explicitly defines this notion, but he must mean something like this: predicate F conceptually entails predicate G if and only if anyone who understands both predicates thereby has compelling reason to believe that everything that satisfies F also satisfies G. I don't see how to define conceptual entailment without making use of some normative notion. Hence, Streumer's error theory undermines his argument against non-reductive realism.

Why does Streumer need a distinction between normative and non-normative properties? Because his argument against non-reductive realism depends on a claim about supervenience, specifically, the supervenience of the normative facts on the non-normative ones. If there are no non-normative facts, then such a supervenience is complete nonsense.

Nota bene: to say that all facts are normative is not to say that there are no normatively indifferent facts. There are many facts that neither violate nor satisfy any norm, and that have no positive or negative value in themselves. However, normative indifference is not the same thing as non-normativity. A normatively indifferent fact might have many normative implications. For example, that Joe is a plumber might be normatively indifferent and yet entail that Joe ought (pro tanto) to be a good plumber.

Streumer's principal argument against non-reductive realism proceeds as follows:

(S) If there are any normative properties, the instantiation of normative properties supervenes on the instantiation of non-normative properties.

(I) If (S) is true, then, for each normative property N, there is a non-normative property D (possibly an infinitely disjunctive property) such that N and D are necessarily coextensive.

(N) Necessarily co-extensive properties are identical.

Therefore, if there are any normative properties, they are reducible to (because identical to) non-normative properties.

Obviously, if there are no non-normative properties, this argument can't get off the ground.

There is a second major problem with Streumer's argument: principle N is much less plausible than the denial of the error theory. I agree with Streumer that, if we are to talk of properties at all, we don't want to individuate properties as finely as we do concepts. However, there is a plausible alternative to both N and conceptual individuation, namely:

(K) If two properties necessarily have the same explanantia and explananda (i.e., if they are explanatorily equivalent), then they are identical.

Properties that are explanatorily equivalent are necessarily co-extensive but not vice versa. Consider, for example, the properties of being a triangle and being a closed figure whose interior angles sum to 180ยบ. It is plausible that the first property will always be part of a geometrical explanation for the instantiation of the second property. Hence, they are not identical, even though necessarily co-extensive. To take a typical scholastic example of a proper accident, to be capable of laughter and to be a rational animal are necessarily co-extensive properties, but the first is explanatorily posterior to the second. A third example involves determinates and determinables, such as red and the various shades of red. The determinable red is necessarily coextensive with the disjunction of its shades, but the instantiation of a particular shade of red is explanatorily prior to the instantiation of the disjunction but explanatorily posterior to the instantiation of the determinable. Hence, the determinable property and the disjunction of its determinates are not identical.

Consider now a normative property N and a necessarily co-extensive, infinitely disjunctive, and non-normative property D. Consider a single disjunct of D, S. Presumably, the instantiation of S would be, on any given occasion, explanatorily prior to the instantiation of both N and D on that same occasion. So far, so good. However, what other facts are explanatorily prior to the instantiation on this occasion of D, or of N? The logical law governing the disjunction is explanatorily prior to the instantiation of D but not to the instantiation of N. And there could be normative laws that are explanatorily prior to the instantiation of N (laws that explain why instantiating S satisfies the relevant norm) but not explanatorily prior to the instantiation of D. Hence, D and N need not be identical.

There is one last difficulty with Streumer's argument against non-reductive realism: his exclusive focus on properties. He never considers the possibility that the non-reductive realist might insist on the existence of non-reductive normative entities. For example, one might hold that certain actions or states (like belief or intention) are irreducibly normative in nature, or that there are irreducibly normative institutions or practices. Streumer assumes without argument that the ontological domains of normative and non-normative facts are identical.

In Chapter XI, Streumer attempts to convert his theory's principal vice (its unbelievability) into a virtue. He believes that he can subvert the force of any purported objection to the error theory by offering an undermining explanation of its apparent force: "What explains why we are more confident that C is true than that T is true is not that C is actually true but is instead that we cannot believe T." (p. 174) However, one does not refute an objection simply by offering a possible explanation for the objection's plausibility that is independent of its truth. One must give some evidence that this offered explanation is actually correct in this case. If I reject a theory T in favor of some more attractive alternative C, I do not have to claim that the only possible explanation of my preference is the actual truth of C. It is sufficient for me to claim that the truth of C is the actual explanation of my preference, and this claim is not refuted by simply pointing out the unbelievability of T.