Unconditional Equals

Unconditional Equals

Anne Phillips, Unconditional Equals, Princeton University Press, 2021, 141pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN9780691226163.

Reviewed by David Livingstone Smith, University of New England


This slender volume, only one hundred twelve pages long, excluding notes and an index, packs a powerful philosophical punch. Conceptually rich and compulsively readable, Unconditional Equals is the most recent iteration of Anne Phillips’ interrogation of the concept of human equality involving both a reprise and reconfiguration of themes from her previous work and a branching out into novel argumentative arenas. It is both a refreshing work of political philosophy and an intellectual memoir describing Phillips’ philosophical trajectory, and contains scrupulously charitable engagements with other equality theorists (for example, Jeremy Waldron and Hannah Arendt), with whom she agrees on some points and disagrees on others.

Unconditional Equality presents the case for making equality central to political activity. This requires a conception of equality that is adequate for the task, which in turn requires a critique of the popular, optimistic story of ever-expanding circles of inclusion. According to this narrative, modern European thinkers fashioned an ideal of equality which was initially applied unevenly but which has, over the centuries, been applied more consistently to all human beings.

Although these men’s rhetoric trumpeted universal equality, in practice equality was limited to the privileged few, whose “high-minded discourse about equality, humanity, and the Rights of Man coincided with the dehumanization of most of the world’s inhabitants, and this coincidence cannot be dismissed as accidental” (14). Phillips does not regard this grotesque contradiction as a puzzling oversight. Rather, she diagnoses it as the upshot of the idea that human equality is contingent on the possession of certain attributes. “From its inception, the modern idea of equality came with conditions as regards character, temperament, rationality, and intelligence; and these conditions made a mockery of much of the language” (15). Elite White men were members of the equality club that women, the poor, and “savages” were barred from entering. As Frantz Fanon searingly observed, these Europeans “have never done talking about Man, yet murder men everywhere they find them” (Fanon, 1963, 251). Sometimes inequality was (and is) essentialized. Entire groups of people are, by their very nature, inferior or superior, “all women, all Hindus, all Africans.” Sometimes, people are deemed inferior because they have not yet, but may at some future point, evolve to become “our” equals.

Phillips emphasizes that we continue to be dogged by the dire consequences of yoking equality to the possession of certain qualities and capacities in our judgments about whose lives matter and whose lives don’t. We all too often indulge in the rhetoric of equality while tolerating, or remaining oblivious to, real, material inequalities—talking the talk, but not walking the walk.

The title of Unconditional Equals alludes to the backbone of Phillips’ core argument—developed at length in her earlier book The Politics of the Human—that frameworks that ground humanness in the possession of certain attributes cannot support the moral weight of human equality. The history of philosophy is littered with such failed attempts. The distinctively human has been variously equated with possessing an Aristotelian rational soul or a Christian immortal one, the capacity for speech, freedom of the will, dignity, or metacognition, among many other candidates. When articulated too concretely, such property-based accounts collide with the problem of marginal cases. They exclude certain members of our species (for example, neonates or the cognitively impaired) from the human family, while including some non-human animals. To circumvent such problems, philosophers have sometimes abstracted away from the concrete details to such a degree that their accounts are too ethereal, too far removed from human experience, to have any real moral heft.

Such analyses cannot ground human equality because they are conditional. In Phillips’ view, unconditional equality is the kind of equality worth wanting. It has seemed obvious to many philosophers and political theorists that there must be something—some feature of human nature—that underwrites human equality. But Phillips argues that real equality is not rooted in the possession certain properties, and looking for such properties is a wild goose chase. Equality is something that we do. “This is equality as enactment,” she writes, “not recognition: not a discovery of something previously concealed but a bringing into existence” (54). We are not created equal, as the United States’ Declaration of Independence would have it. Rather, we make ourselves equal through our political endeavors. I am reminded of a statement by Malcolm X at the founding of the Organization of Afro-American Unity in 1964 that coincides with Phillips’ vision of equality, “We declare our right on this earth to be a human being, to be given the rights of a human being in this society, on this earth, in this day, which we intend to bring into existence by any means necessary” (1992, 84). Malcolm X did not demand that Black people’s humanity be discovered by Whites. He declared that Black people would bring their humanity into existence. Humanity (and thus equality) are outcomes of, rather than a precondition for, political activity.

Phillips develops the thesis of enacted equality in interesting and, in my view, very significant ways. For example, in a lengthy discussion of identity politics, she argues that identity politics is not (as some interpret it) primarily or exclusively about recognition. Identity politics is about equality, including equality of material conditions. The final chapter is devoted to the thorny question of what, exactly, equality is. According to Mill, equality is the absence of legal prohibitions applied to some groups but not others. But Phillips rightly treats this as too restrictive, pointing out that “it fails sufficiently to register the ways in which our seeming choices are shaped, not just by the prohibitions, but the expectations of those around us, and the often-daunting difficulties of choosing anything else” (88). Oppressed groups may have legally-enforced equality of opportunity without having genuine equality of opportunity. Although this should be obvious, it needs to be said. As Martin Luther King once remarked, “What does it profit a man to be able to eat at an integrated lunch counter if he doesn't earn enough money to buy a hamburger and a cup of coffee?” (Hohmann 2018).

Phillips argues that the best check on the degree to which equality of opportunity has really been achieved is to juxtapose opportunity with outcome. If there exists ostensible equality of opportunity between demographic groups—that is, if there are no discriminative legal restrictions on such groups—but outcomes are highly unequal, this is a good reason to suspect that in such cases “equality of opportunity” is not so equal after all. To think otherwise is to “appeal uncritically to the exercise of free choice” leading to, or rather, seeming to justify, the assumption that inequality of outcome is the upshot of the preferences or innate deficits of those who fall short. That is, to naturalize inequality. Appealing to such preferences to explain unequal outcomes is rooted in an idealized vision of human autonomy, because “what we think of as our freely chosen preferences are often the results of heavily policed social pressures that already position us as unequals (91, emphasis added).

Equality is not sameness. Divergent paths through life do not equate to inequality, even though some trajectories are disadvantageous. Neither is equality conformity or assimilation. Equality is not achieved by refashioning oneself or being refashioned in accord with the social norms of the majority. Treating people as equals does not entail treating them in the same way, and it does not mean that you must like them, feel comfortable with them, or want to associate with them. Treating people as equals does not contravene making moral distinctions between them. Instead:

What regarding everyone as an equal rules out is treating those whose views you find offensive, whose behavior you find objectionable, or whose personality you dislike, as therefore objects of contempt, beneath your consideration, no longer entitled to a basic level of respect. (43)

Often, Phillips remarks, people are said to be equal despite their differences, as though difference presents a barrier to equality. The thought here seems to be that equality is based on properties that all humans share that are more fundamental than the differences between them. But on Phillips’ enactivist account, equality is not antithetical to difference, although the systematic imposition of difference certainly is. She stresses that “equality is something we make happen in those moments when we assert ourselves as equals. . . . Equality is a commitment and a claim” (112). We do not discover human equality. We bring it into existence.


Fanon, F. (1963). The Wretched of the Earth. London: Penguin.

Hohmann, J. (2018). “The Daily 202: MLK’s final speech—delivered 50 years ago today—was full of timely and timeless teachings,” The Washington Post, April 3, 2018.

Malcolm X (1992). By Any Means Necessary (Malcolm X, Speeches and Writings). New York: Pathfinder.

Phillips, A. (2015) The Politics of the Human. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.