Underivative Duty: British Moral Philosophers from Sidgwick to Ewing

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Thomas Hurka (ed.), Underivative Duty: British Moral Philosophers from Sidgwick to Ewing, Oxford University Press, 2011, 225pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199577446.

Reviewed by David Phillips, University of Houston


Underivative Duty: British Moral Philosophers from Sidgwick to Ewing is a collection of 10 essays by distinguished contemporary moral philosophers, growing out of a conference held at the University of Toronto in 2008. There are two related but distinct guiding ideas behind the conference and the volume. First, in thinking about the history of moral philosophy, we should reject the influential idea that Moore's Principia represented a "clean break" from the past. Moore should instead be placed in the middle of a tradition or school of moral philosophers stretching from Sidgwick (the first edition of whose The Methods of Ethics appeared in 1874) to Ewing (whose Second Thoughts in Moral Philosophy was published in 1959). As Hurka argues, despite their various important differences, the philosophers of this school have important commonalities: (as familiar labels for the school suggest) non-naturalism and intuitionism; (less familiarly, but in Hurka's view equally importantly) commitments to what Hurka labels "conceptual minimalism", "inherent explanations" and (the titular concept) "underivative duty". Second, contemporary moral philosophers have much to learn from the writings of the Sidgwick to Ewing school. For their work is of high quality, and while the kinds of view they held were unfashionable and subject to dismissive caricature in the philosophical climate of the 1950s and 1960s, with the resurgence of non-naturalism in the recent work, inter alia, of Nagel, Parfit, and Scanlon, a careful and sympathetic reexamination of the earlier non-naturalist tradition is peculiarly timely. This collection makes a most valuable case for and contribution to that reexamination.

In the limited space I have here I cannot properly review all the essays in the volume. Instead, I shall try to do three things: to say more about Hurka's conceptualization of the central unifying themes in the work of the Sidgwick to Ewing school (hereafter "SE school philosophers"); to reflect a bit on one important issue that arises in more than one essay in this volume, and that is central to the moral-theoretic differences among SE School philosophers: the coherence or defensibility of deontology; and to think more about the answer the volume suggests to a generic question raised whenever we start to reexamine a neglected philosophical tradition: how much of the work in that tradition is of both really high quality and genuine contemporary interest?

There is much that is instructive and illuminating in the way Hurka characterizes the SE school in the brief introduction to the volume and in his own longer paper, "Common Themes from Sidgwick to Ewing". As noted above, insofar as the school has recognized labels those labels would be "intuitionist" or "non-naturalist". Hurka both introduces new terminology for shared aspects of the school not highlighted in these familiar labels and suggests, at least tentatively, that this terminology may suggest a more conceptually adequate (though not especially euphonious) alternative label "underivativists".

Focus first on some of the useful new terminology, beginning with "conceptual minimalism", "the view that all normative judgments can be expressed using just a few basic concepts" (7). The idea here is that the SE school philosophers all worked with a quite restricted range of irreducible thin normative concepts: for Sidgwick only the fundamental concept expressed by "ought" or "right", for Moore and others only the concept 'good', for Ross and others both of these. In this way their approach conflicts sharply with two lines of thought prominent in later moral theory: that there is a basic distinction between rational and moral 'ought's, and that proper moral theorizing involves detailed attention to multiple thick ethical concepts. Hurka argues plausibly that it is a merit of this conceptual minimalism that it tends to make normative questions substantive rather than conceptual. (There is a further interesting question here whether Hurka is right to suggest that the single 'ought' of the SE school philosophers is more properly to be thought of as the 'ought' of morality rather than as the 'ought' of reason. Such a suggestion would distance the SE school philosophers from contemporary non-naturalists whose core concept tends to be that of a (non-moral) reason. And there is room to argue that Hurka's suggestion about the moral character of the unitary SE school 'ought' does not fit at least Sidgwick.)

A second suggestive idea is that of "inherent explanations". As Hurka explains the idea, "inherent explanations explain common-sense moral judgments by connecting them to principles that are more abstract but use similar concepts, so they are continuous with the common-sense judgements and concern the same general subject" (20). Sidgwick's grounding of utilitarianism in two philosophical intuitions is supposed to be one example of a purported inherent explanation; Rashdall, Moore, and Ross's account of virtue as a higher level intrinsic good is supposed to be another. By contrast, Hurka suggests, many famous philosophical projects of the last half-century have involved "external" approaches, "connecting an everyday moral claim to one that uses different concepts and concerns some other, more fundamental, topic" (21), among them Hare's attempt to ground moral judgments by appeal to claims about moral language, and, most significantly, Rawls's justification of his principles of justice by appeal to the claim that they would be chosen by rational contractors in the original position. Hurka develops further the idea of external explanations in discussing Rawls, noting that, "Since the specification of Rawls's original position depends on moral judgments, his justification is not extra-moral . . . but it is external . . . since ideas about rational contracting are far removed from everyday talk of equality and rights" (21).

While suggestive, the idea that there is a clear contrast between SE philosophers' inherent explanations and later philosophers' external approaches is also problematic. Hurka notes one kind of problem himself, suggesting for instance that Sidgwick's grounding of egoism on the claim that individuals are metaphysically distinct is a non-inherent explanation (22). Another kind of problem is raised by an important feature of the work of Sidgwick and his successors considered by Hurka elsewhere in the essay but not in this connection. Sidgwick and other SE school philosophers recognize the fallibility of moral intuitions. Sidgwick explicitly lays out four conditions that apparently self-evident claims have to meet, and he seems to justify these conditions in part by appeal to the history of thought, the history both of successful and of failed appeals to apparently self-evident principles in other disciplines as well as in ethics. If the appeal to these four conditions plays a role in justifying Sidgwick's proto-utilitarian axioms, and if the four conditions are themselves justified by this kind of appeal to the history of thought, does Sidgwick's project, or those of his successors who implicitly or explicitly accept much the same methodological fallibilism, really count as less external than the projects of a Rawls or a Gauthier?

Now turn to the titular concept of "underivative duty" and to the suggestion that it provides a better label for the SE school philosophers than "intuitionists" or "non-naturalists". It is worth emphasizing again that Hurka is tentative in this labeling suggestion. In the introduction to the volume (1), after suggesting that "non-naturalists" or "intuitionists" are unsatisfactory labels because they highlight only common metaethical views, not common views in normative theory, he concedes that "underivativist" also highlights only some shared beliefs. In his own longer essay, by contrast, he comes closer to advocating the labeling change, saying that "if we ask for a single, central belief of the Sidgwick-to-Ewing school, it is that some moral duties, the fundamental ones, are underivative" (24). Hurka goes on to say that "the claim that duty is underivative can be made at three different levels": first, normative judgments as a whole are not derivable from non-normative judgments; second, moral judgments are not derivable from non-moral normative judgments; third, in the view of deontologists like Ross, but not consequentialists like Sidgwick and Moore, deontological duties cannot be derived from a more fundamental duty to promote the good. Since, however, this third belief is shared only by some SE school philosophers, in focusing on the merits of "underivativist" as a labeling concept for the school as a whole we should consider only the first two beliefs/levels.

The question is whether "underivativist" is a better label than "non-naturalist" or "intuitionist". As Hurka suggests, we should understand non-naturalism as the combination of "the realist thesis that some moral judgments are objectively true with the autonomy-of-ethics thesis that they are neither reducible to nor derivable from non-moral judgments" (11).

Using the label "non-naturalist", then, serves to highlight something not explicitly brought out by the label "underivativist": the commitment to realism. Hurka is right that this realist commitment is not always argued for by non-naturalists, and that in late work, when non-cognitivism came into fashion, some SE school philosophers were tempted to backtrack on the realist commitment. But that realist commitment is still crucial in separating SE school philosophers from skeptical noncognitivists and error theorists, and so should not be given up lightly. The label "underivativist" serves to highlight something not brought out by "non-naturalist": the idea that there is only a single kind of normative judgment. Both the label "non-naturalist" and the label "underivativist" highlight the commitment to the autonomy of ethics. Hurka is right then, I think, to be tentative in pushing his revised labeling suggestion: while "underivativist" does bring out something important not brought out by "non-naturalist", the reverse is also true; neither label seems to me clearly more comprehensive and satisfactory than the other.

Turn now, briefly, to the second item on my agenda: to do a little to trace the important theme of the coherence or defensibility of deontology through a couple of the papers in the collection. The most sustained treatment in the collection comes in Robert Shaver's paper, "The Birth of Deontology". Shaver suggests that the debate between ideal utilitarians and deontologists (which could not be properly pursued prior to the clear articulation of ideal utilitarianism by Moore and others) turns on whether there is an agent- and time-neutral form of consequentialism which can properly generate the same verdicts as Rossian deontology. Contemporary presentations of the debate between consequentialists and their critics typically take the issue to turn on cases of minimizing violations where (e.g.) I can minimize promise-breakings by breaking my own promise. But, Shaver suggests, Carritt and Ross do not stress such cases. They either deny that there is a genuine agent-neutral good available to explain our intuitions about promises, or make a claim about the order of explanation, that it is the duty that explains the good, not vice versa. Hurka presents this latter line sympathetically, remarking that the most common objection is not that consequentialism gets the wrong results: it is that Consequentialism "gives the wrong explanation for its results even when those are right . . . consequentialism turns the duty to keep promises into a quite different duty to promote the good" (19). But Shaver is much less sympathetic: he remarks that "the claim that the order of explanation is from the duty to the good is hard to assess" (138).

Consider finally the question of the quality and contemporary interest of the work of the SE school philosophers. Here it is worth distinguishing two versions of the philosophical resurrection project Hurka advocates and to which the volume as a whole makes a pioneering contribution. To see the distinction, consider another fairly recent attempt to treat a somewhat neglected philosophical tradition and relate it to contemporary concerns: Stephen Darwall's The British Moralists and the Internal 'Ought': 1640-1740. It is one thing to be persuaded by reading Darwall to return to Hobbes or Locke or Hume and to read them carefully with fresh eyes. It is another to be persuaded that one really ought to spend more time reading Cudworth. Similarly here, a more modest version of the resurrection project would suggest the philosophical value of careful attention to the leading figures of the SE school. A more ambitious version would claim that even the work of the less familiar figures is of serious contemporary philosophical interest. No doubt there is room for debate as to where to draw the distinction between major and minor figures. But, of the philosophers whose work is explicitly considered in this collection, Sidgwick, Moore and Ross are strong candidates to be major figures; by contrast, Rashdall, Carritt, Ewing, and McTaggart are clear candidates to be minor; Prichard (and perhaps Broad, not the main subject of any specific essay in the collection) may be borderline cases. How far, then, do the essays here persuade us not just that Sidgwick's Methods or Ross's The Right and The Good are worthy subjects of serious study, but that the same is true for the works of Rashdall, McTaggart, Carritt, or Ewing?

The evidence here (at least, the evidence from the essays by authors other than Hurka himself) is, at best, mixed. Anthony Skelton suggests plausibly that Rashdall makes a different, less stark, case for ideal utilitarianism than Moore. But it is easy to be less stark than Moore, and Skelton concedes that the strategy of argument directly pursued by Rashdall is limited in its contemporary interest to the extent that its central object is to defend ideal utilitarianism against hedonism rather than against Prichard's and Ross's deontology. Dennis McKerlie, writing on McTaggart on love, while finding a good deal to admire in McTaggart's work, concludes in part "I would not claim that McTaggart's contribution to moral philosophy matches those made by Moore, Ross, and Prichard" (86). Insofar as T.H.Irwin argues for parity between major and minor figures of the SE school, such parity tends to be the result of downgrading the major figures rather than upgrading the minor ones. He begins his contribution with the line "If one wanted to raise any doubt about whether the Oxford intuitionists . . . belonged to a golden age of ethical theory, one might cite their lamentable failure to appreciate Aristotle's ethics" (106). Jonas Olson and Mark Timmons find A.C. Ewing's attempt to defend a metaethical position intermediate between non-naturalism and non-cognitivist irrealism a failure, interesting and instructive in its way, but not, their work tends to suggest, interesting and instructive enough to make it compulsory reading for metaethicists.

The moral this reader is inclined to draw from the collection as a whole on this matter is that conventional philosophical wisdom is vindicated to at least this extent: the work of the SE school likely to be of most direct interest to contemporary moral philosophers is the work of those figures who never entirely disappeared from the philosophical radar screen and whose importance is now quite widely recognized. (A recent Leiter Reports poll asking for "the best/most important books in ethics of the past 200 years" had Sidgwick's Methods third, Moore's Principia fifth, and Ross's The Right and The Good a runner-up for the top ten.) Insofar as we should read Carritt, Ewing, McTaggart or Rashdall, the motivation is more likely to be to set the context for these more major figures than it is to champion their views for their own sake. Such a moral can, at this stage, be suggested only quite tentatively; and, if correct, would do little to undermine the central ideas behind the collection. As Hurka rightly observes, very little scholarly and philosophical work has been done on any SE school philosopher other than Moore. There remains a great deal of scope for new insights, discoveries, and interpretive questions as philosophers interested by the new non-naturalism begin really to explore and assimilate the most recent and sophisticated prior philosophical work located within the same broad logical space.