Understanding African Philosophy: A Cross-Cultural Approach to Classical and Contemporary Issues

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Bell, Richard H., Understanding African Philosophy: A Cross-Cultural Approach to Classical and Contemporary Issues, Routledge, 2002, 208pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 041593972.

Reviewed by Lee Brown, Howard University


I strongly recommend this book to anyone who has had an interest in studying the way of life of others, but for various reasons has had misgivings about how to proceed. Although the focus of the book is on understanding philosophical perspectives of African cultures, it speaks well to what is required to appreciate or otherwise acquire an in-depth understanding of any culture –including one’s own. The opening statement of Bell’s first chapter characterizes the central aim of philosophy as seeing something as it is. The notion of “seeing something as it is” is a dominant theme in his writing and he attempts to show that to appreciate a way of life of another is to see it as it is. In this regard, Bell borrows from the perspectives of Ludwig Wittgenstein and Peter Winch on what is needed for competency in comparative and interdisciplinary philosophy–for realizing what Bell calls cross-cultural understanding.

This theme guides the writing of his book. Underlying it is the conjecture that individuals and human kind will surely flourish more humanely by their understanding each other’s worlds. The book ends with the suggestion that by clearly seeing how others express themselves, and through responding by finding appropriate landmarks within ourselves, a greater self-understanding will be realized. For Bell, the pinnacle of such a practice can be found in the carrying out of the mission of South Africa’s Truth and Reconciliation Commission. Through it, the humanity of warring individuals was given an opportunity to surface, to be recognized, and to be appreciated. Thereby, individuals from different cultural orientations were able to come to see the humanity in each other and to treat each other accordingly –with the respect and dignity accorded the recognition of another’s humanity. Moreover, it availed the individual the opportunity to see the humanity within himself, and to act and to behave accordingly.

For professional philosophers and the academic community at large, the content of the book is likely to be viewed as insightful, illuminating, and significant. In brief, it is an interesting, informative, and enjoyable read, and I find that refreshing given the tremendous richness of its content. In addition, it will likely be found readily accessible to most anyone with more than an eighth-grade education. The book is broken into seven sections –each building upon the previous to ground the thesis that Westerners can acquire a greater understanding of what is required for peace and for humane flourishing by better understanding the philosophical grounding of traditional African cultures. One of the underlying tenets of Bell’s work is that the collective experiences of Africans–from their communal pre-colonial period through their postcolonial period–have given rise to ethical perspectives in modern African philosophical thought that offer invaluable insights into what it is to treat humanely persons who are otherwise viewed as markedly different. Bell contends that by viewing African cultures through their conceptual lenses, Westerners will not only acquire a genuine appreciation of the wisdoms within African cultures, but Westerners will also acquire a richer understanding of themselves. The quality of aesthetic sensitivity that Bell contends is needed for genuinely understanding another culture is thought to foster a heightened understanding of what it is to be humane and to treat others humanely. It seems fair to say that Bell is suggesting that such sensitivity should be more prominent in Western culture.

Concerning the larger content of the book, Bell begins by illuminating the history of the debate on whether within traditional African cultures there exist philosophical perspectives or a philosophy, in a more general sense, that also can be characterized as African. Bell presents clear characterizations of the early internal struggles among African intellectuals to reach consensus on what non-Africans should view as African Philosophy. The reader is made aware of the grounding of such concerns and of why their appreciation requires that they be viewed through the conceptual lenses of both Western and African cultures. In discussing this issue, Bell illuminates the relevant perspectives of Hallen, Houndtondji, Quine, Sodipo, Soyinka, Wiredu, Wittgenstein, and others. His discussions include concerns about what counts as philosophy, meaning, and faithful translation.

In Chapter 2, Bell discusses the foundations of modern African philosophical thought, and he discusses concerns about there being an African consciousness. He also discusses characterizations of African philosophy as ethno-philosophy and as the “negritude” movement. Bell focuses upon issues concerning the philosophical content within the “sagacious” tradition of African thought and shows its merits in light of the more heralded “critical” and “scientific” traditions usually associated with Western cultures. Concerns about the extent to which African thought must be critical and scientific in order to be philosophical are also explored. In addition, he explores concerns about whether thought being critical and scientific is sufficient for it to be philosophical. Among the perspectives discussed in this chapter are those of Abrahams, Amo, Bodunrin, Herskovits, Hountondji, Irele, Gyekye, Nkrumah, Oruka, Senghor, Soyinka, Tempels, Wiredu, and others.

Chapters 3 and 4 provide a substantial part of the foundation for advancing Bell’s advocacy for Westerners to take what he characterizes as an aesthetic approach to understanding African culture. In brief, that approach is one whereby understanding is achieved through viewing others through their conceptual lenses. Bell contends that by taking an aesthetic approach to understanding others, we can view how others see us and we can acquire a deeper and broader understanding of others and ourselves, as well. He also contends that by taking such an approach, Westerners can acquire a greater understanding of what is required for peace and for humane flourishing.

In Chapter 3, Bell explores the contributions of African humanism and socialism to the rise of postcolonial African philosophical thought. The discussion includes distinguishing African humanism from Western humanism and African socialism from Marxist and Soviet characterizations. He introduces the notion that African socialism is distinguished by its emphasis upon spiritual flourishing. The chapter also includes discussions about the influence of 17th- and 18th-century European philosophers on the shaping of racist perspectives on the intellectual abilities of people of color. Bell explores discussions about conceptions of race and racism and discussions of how the dehumanizing effects of Western colonialism brought forth strong moral themes in postcolonial African philosophy. The perspectives of Baldwin, DuBois, Fanon, Hegel, Hume, Kant, and West are central to the discussion.

In Chapter 4, Bell explores differences between individualism and African communalism, and in doing so, he discusses their implications for concerns about how best to deal with suffering and injustice. He explores various characterizations of personhood and discusses how the concept of being a person within African cultures differs from that in Western cultures. In traditional African cultures, being a person is an earned phenomenon and as such takes account of how one lives one’s life. Within, say, Yoruba culture, being a conscious and self-reflective individual is not sufficient for being a person. Therein, one must be ethical and one must follow a path that is in harmony with one’s given spiritual nature. On the other hand, it can be argued that Western cultures permit distinguishing whether a person’s actions are ethical or unethical, while doing likewise appears problematic for Yoruba culture. Among the perspectives discussed in this chapter are those of Gyekye, Head, Krog, Mbiti, Menkiti, McIntyre, Nietzsche, Nussbaum, Soyinka, and Weils.

In Chapter 5, Bell provides a careful and in-depth characterization of the underlying humanitarian grounding for the ethical, social, and political achievements of South Africa’s Truth and Reconciliation Commission. He also characterizes the shortcomings of the TRC. A dominant consideration in the chapter is what should be counted as just treatment of others. For those who seek a clear and accurate characterization of the mission of the TRC, or seek a grounding complement to the work of John Rawls, the content of this chapter is worth the price of the book. Bell also discusses the concepts of mutual respect and forgiveness and their roles in fostering environments for humane flourishing. This and the two preceding chapters provide the foundation for what I see as the moral message of Bell’s work.

In Chapter 6, Bell characterizes the concept of narrative and its function in traditional African cultures. Narratives include oral traditions, literature, and works within the fine arts. Bell suggests that philosophy is not adequate to capture all that is important to be known within a culture. He suggests that to understand a culture, one must come to view it through its various means of self-expression and that music, painting, and the like are all valuable venues for learning what was felt and thought by a people. In advancing this view, he discusses the perspectives of Appiah, Baldwin, Chernoff, Gyekye, Head, Okri, Nietzsche, Soyinka, Wiredu, Wittgenstein, and others.

In “Some Concluding Remarks” Bell provides an overview of his work. As mentioned earlier, Bell’s work has a strong moral current running throughout. It seems fair to say that Bell is concerned with what he sees as shortcomings in Western conceptions of justice and in how justice is practiced. It also seems fair to say that Bell contends that traditional African conceptions of justice and the ‘evolved’ conception reflected in South Africa’s TRC provide a viable platform for Western philosophers to revisit their current conceptions of justice. This Bell contends would foster a more humane vision of others and enable the development of a more humane society. Bell’s work provides well-supported reasons for taking such an approach. In brief, he contends that the quality of life of individuals and of society as whole would be significantly enhanced by doing so.

I recommend this book because of the wealth of information it contains about the history of the developments that have led to the current concerns within African philosophical thought, because of Bell’s clear presentation, and because of the book’s potential to make a significant difference in how the Western community views suffering, injustice, humane flourishing, and itself.