Understanding Deleuze, Understanding Modernism

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Paul Ardoin, S. E. Gontarski, and Laci Mattison (eds.), Understanding Deleuze, Understanding Modernism, Bloomsbury, 2014, 284pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781623563493.

Reviewed by James Williams, University of Dundee


In his essay from this collection on Deleuze and modernism, 'Diagrammatic Modernism: Abstraction, Immanence, and the Positions of Style', Joe Hughes suggests an important definition of modernism through techniques. His argument is partly that Deleuze's philosophy can be understood as the introduction of modernist techniques into philosophy in order to break with 'habits and conventions of reading and writing philosophy' (38). Hughes names 'collage, deformation, decontextualization and defamiliarization' as such techniques (39). Though this collection makes claims towards an understanding of Deleuze and of modernism, not least in its title, it also fits this definition of modernism. There is an element of collage, deformation, decontextualization and defamiliarization to the volume. This means that the idea of understanding is also challenged and transformed by many of its chapters.

Let's start with collage. The series editors make the following claim: 'Our goal in each volume of the series is to understand literary modernism better through philosophy as we also better understand a philosopher through literary modernism' (xiii). We might think that this overall aim -- to understand better -- leads to a consistent account of a philosopher in relation to modernism. That's not the case here. Instead, the collected essays form a collage giving a fractured and disparate account of Deleuze and Guattari's debt to modernism and their gifts in return (Guattari is elided from the volume title as per usual yet unjust practice). This is a great strength because it has allowed the editors to bring together experts in the field and let them loose on topics of direct interest to them and in touch with their cutting edge research. All the collected essays have value, and many are outstanding reflections on modernism with a Deleuzo-Guattarian flavour. If you want to learn from some of the deepest and most original work on Deleuze, Guattari and literature available today, this is the book for you. If you are currently doing advanced research on Deleuze, Guattari and literature, this collection will be a valuable resource for studies and positions in relation to which your thesis should be critically situated.

However, this also means that if you are looking for a traditional understanding of modernism and of Deleuze and Guattari, you are bound to be greatly disappointed, because the idea of understanding as a stable and unified meaning is challenged and usurped here. This is not only because there are many different and sometimes incompatible views drawn together. It is also because many of the interpretations of modernism are often self-avowedly evasive and performed as such. At its most extreme, this effect brings us close to one of Deleuze's favourite authors, Lewis Carroll, and the mad tea-party. It turns out that to understand modernism we have to understand that we cannot understand what modernism is but rather experience what it does as something disunited and discombobulating.

For instance, on first reading, Christopher Langlois' definition of the task of modernism seems rather nightmarish, at least as a form of stable understanding:

The task of modernism, like the task of post-Leibnizian perspectivism as described by Deleuze, is to give access to the unplumbed depths of the imagination and of reality, tearing open the surface and the façade of the latter and revealing it as the incompossible set of anamorphic, hallucinatory, and fictional collection of possibilities that reasonable and nonmetaphysical monads otherwise desire it to disavow. (220)

Modernism, as traced through Deleuze, is therefore about effects and events that shatter a unified view of the world and replace it by perspectives. These fragments function as revelations of an underlying series of forces and images that not only haunt the apparent order of the world, but also explain its cracks and metamorphoses. Deleuzo-Guattarian modernism expresses the truth of the world as liminal and troubling disjunctions. Things are never as they appear and modernism must therefore be an act of deformation revealing the underbelly of appearance.

With characteristic sure-footedness and economy of thought, Ian Buchanan explains how this duty to deform also becomes the task to change what modernism is. Philosophical and artistic creations become self-transforming by shifting the context and manner of their own practices in order to start anew:

What the modernists invented, then, was a new way of holding things together in an artistic sense. By which I mean to say that modernism was first of all a concept -- we did not invent the term 'modernism' to retrospectively classify and describe an artistic movement, as we did with 'classicism'; rather, modernism as a movement came into being by first of all inventing the concept of modernism. (197)

This concept does not then stand once and for all, though. The invention is open-ended and unsettled. Modernism is the movement where art enacts its own definition:

Instead of an unfolding tradition in which art was produced according to a received understanding of what art was, modernism taught the world that art could be anything we were prepared to say was art and could, in Deleuze's and Guattari's sense, make 'stand up' as art. (197)

Against accusations of irresponsibility and triteness, Buchanan's point is rather that this self-positing creativity is an essential aspect of clinical attention to our own ills and weaknesses: 'In Deleuze and Guattari's view, Artaud created art in order to, if not heal himself, then at least find a way of living in the circumstances -- mental, physical, material, and so on -- he found himself in.' (198) In order to understand Artaud's creative struggles and sometimes extreme output as interesting to Deleuze and Guattari we have to interpret them as attempts at a form of reflexive healing. Buchanan therefore reads the Deleuzo-Guattarian practice of schizoanalysis as harnessing creative drives in a difficult and intricate balancing act between the destructive potential of desire and its capacity to heal a body in libidinal crisis. Anna Powell gives a succinct and yet suggestive definition of schizoanalysis as art practice, in line with Buchanan's study, towards the end of the volume: 'The schizo forces of experimental art, rather than being pathologized and diagnosed, can thus be put to use as an ongoing and vital process of becoming.' (274) Working in a department where philosophy and art practice are combined in many of our courses, this summary makes sense to me. The modern art school is a multitude of directions breaking off from one another and forming uneasy alliances with a wide range of social and academic sources and material. Yet these aesthetic schisms are not pointless and self-absorbed fancies, but rather vibrant experimentation with new ways of living with the violent and often cruel demands of modern societies.

Healing through deformation is perhaps a surprising idea to find in an academic work, but it is a recurring theme of this volume. It takes many forms, for instance, in Claire Colebrook's study of the parallels between modernist and Deleuzo-Guattarian attempts to take art and philosophy beyond the confines of the human mind and body. Deleuze and Guattari turn the Cartesian subject-centred world inside out and dissolve the world as measured and valued according to the human organism. In this they repeat earlier modernist dislocations of human experience outward to disembodied emotions and perceptions, which then take on lives of their own, independent of the gravity of individual human possession:

Not only do Woolf and Eliot anticipate Deleuze and Guattari's affects and percepts, there is a broader resonance between modernism's impersonal, inhuman and virtual plane of thinking (where thinking includes concepts, affects and percepts), and Deleuze's philosophy of immanence where thoughts are not pictures or ideas of the world, but compose one of the worlds that make up the domain of reality that includes the virtual and the actual and is definitely more than human. (240)

So when we ask, sceptically, why any of this would have a healing quality, the answer is in fact quite familiar, even if its remedies are not. Modernism is part of the healing of life because it is closer to the truth of sickness and hence to new ways of living with the fact and threat of ill-health.

Thus, in his contribution to the volume, Aidan Tynan explains how modernism adds to and goes beyond a strictly medical approach to illness and thereby extends the resources we have to work on symptoms that are not only of the body, or of the mind, but also social, economic and environmental:

Again, literature is central. Deleuze and Guattari, speaking in an interview shortly after the publication of Anti-Oedipus, say that people may criticise their account of schizophrenia as not clinical enough, as being overly reliant on literary authors. But they suggest that these authors often manifest a preoccupation with health that diverges from established medicine. (59)

This is an important point because it rebuffs a powerful yet also quite slanted critical point. Shouldn't philosophical and artistic modernism ally itself to the driving modern forces of science and its technological applications, developed with most obvious benefits in drug-based medicine? The answer is that modernism enters into a supportive and critical relation to this kind of teleological scientific modernist movement. It does not seek to supplant it but rather adds voices of caution, images of what might have been left out, openings for different and yet effective approaches, and warnings about monstrous off-shoots of no doubt well-intentioned progressive activity.

This collection is a long and rewarding set of essays on the different ways in which modernist works and the philosophy of Deleuze and Guattari can add to the resources for thinking through a condition that has now become post-human. It is not possible to do justice to each essay or to the excellent and very helpful glossary entries at the end of the book. So I want to draw attention to a few ideas that illustrate this connection between Deleuze, Guattari, modernism and demands that force us to shift our patterns of thought beyond familiar human values and norms. Carrie Rohman demonstrates how Deleuze and Guattari's concept of becoming-animal can be elucidated by reading it alongside D. H. Lawrence in order to demonstrate new ways of interpreting the author and the 'critically under-examined' theme of dance in his work (169). In dance, we do not enter into an analogical relation to animals. Instead, animals and humans form assemblages, in the sense that neither part of the assemblage is complete without the other, as it would be in an analogy, but rather where the new whole exceeds the definitions of its parts.

Anthony Uhlmann employs this novel conception of the part-whole relation to original and insightful effect in his reading of Deleuze's Essays Critical and Clinical as a modernist text. Here, it is the idea of human interpretation as the construction of a consistent whole that is challenged and replaced by something more subtle:

Once we begin to consider the work as a whole, and as a whole comprised of relations 'that are external to their terms' -- that is, as a non-organic whole, a whole that has been constructed and has to be reconstructed in the act of reading -- Essays Critical and Clinical completely changes its character. (122)

This explains why the idea of the fragment recurs in this volume, such that it is its most consistent idea about modernism. The modern work is a demonstration of the fractured nature of the whole when taken as a self-sufficient organism, but not when taken as an unstable and ongoing act of harmonisation.

This idea is shown at its most powerful in a philosophical context in Wahida Khandker's original and important explanation of Deleuze's departure from Bergson regarding ideas of the actual and virtual and thanks to the addition of a Spinozist account of memory:

Deleuze's reading of Bergsonian method in the final chapters of Bergsonism, as the resolution of differences by means of a monism of multiple and opposing tendencies, requires an appeal to an original creative principle in order to demonstrate how the communication between 'heterogeneous series' is in fact primary . . . (29)

Heterogeneity in the one and as primary principle is another, more philosophical, way of understanding the priority assigned to the fragment in any modernist whole. It is a lesson explained well in relation to film, an art that remains marginal in the volume, in Nadine Boljkovac's lucid account of the new definition of memory emerging from Deleuze and modernism: 'Memory in this way is more accurately an assemblage of singular sensations, bodily encounters of connections, actions and reactions' (265). If I shut my eyes and try to recollect my recent very rough crossing of the North Sea, this account seems exactly right, from the dizzy tumble, hard crashes in the trough of the waves, sickly camaraderie and shared fears.

I will conclude with a perhaps churlish qualm or cranky misgiving, not so much about the quality of this volume on the terms it has set itself with respect to artistic modernism and Deleuze and Guattari, but rather to extensions of the modern that seem essential 'in these times', as they say. The worry came about when reading the outstanding glossary entry on the rhizome, written by Eugene Holland. He is one of the foremost and most impassioned commentators on Deleuze and Guattari and politics, in particular in relation to their critique of global capitalism. So, in reflecting upon the idea of the 'rhizome-book' he remarks that 'the aim of such a book . . . is not to represent the world as it is or what it means, but to survey and map its tendencies and becomings, for better and for worse, so as to be able to affirm the former and avert the latter' (272). It is of course no coincidence that Holland reminds us of the debt to Marx in Deleuze and Guattari and political modernism. This progressive political and philosophical side of modernism is strangely lacking in the book. It is an absence that cannot be seen as a flaw on its own terms, yet it made me feel uneasy and fleetingly sad. I wanted to scream a new slogan: Modernism is collectively political, or it dies. No doubt the authors will respond that their works are political in the sense of seeking to change situations for the better on a micro-political plane. True. Yet I sensed too great an emphasis on individual ills and local connections, rather than collective action, for either Deleuze or modernism to be up to the challenges of the collapse of progressive late-modern societies and their eyeless tottering into something far worse.