Understanding Eating Disorders: Conceptual and Ethical Issues in the Treatment of Anorexia and Bulimia Nervosa

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Simona Giordano, Understanding Eating Disorders: Conceptual and Ethical Issues in the Treatment of Anorexia and Bulimia Nervosa, Oxford University Press, 2005, 297pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199269742.

Reviewed by Lisa Heldke, Gustavus Adolphus College


Understanding Eating Disorders endeavors to answer the question "How should we behave when dealing with a person with eating disorders?" (254). In the pursuit of this question, Giordano undertakes two primary tasks. First, she constructs an analysis of eating disorders that attempts to show why they should be understood "from a moral perspective. Eating disorders signify a person's belonging and adherence to a determined moral context" (8). Second, she conducts an exploration of autonomy, and asks whether it is justified to regard persons with mental illnesses in general, and persons with eating disorders in particular, as lacking autonomy, and thus as candidates for paternalistic treatment -- force feeding, for instance.

In pursuit of the first task, Giordano makes a challenging, intriguing, yet ultimately unsatisfying claim. As I noted, she asserts that eating disorders ought to be understood "from a moral perspective." However, in the end, we must realize that "If the logic that underlies eating disorders is a moral logic, then understanding and unmasking that logic has, as a consequence, the loss of ethics." Thus, "the question 'What is it ethical to do?' will appear to be, in an important way, the wrong question" (9). The right question, it turns out, is "why do people want what they want (in this case thinness)?" -- a question that ultimately collapses ethics into psychology.

In arguing that eating disorders should be understood from a moral perspective, Giordano shows why received analyses of eating disorders are incomplete or inadequate. Unlike those accounts, she argues that it is crucial to attempt to understand the behavior of the person with eating disorders -- that only such understanding will enable ethical treatment of that person. Giordano calls upon literature and art to illustrate her claim that the disordered eater actually manifests Western culture's moral valuing of lightness -- indeed, sometimes manifests that value more consistently and thoroughgoingly than do ordinary individuals. Contrary to theorists who analyze the desire for thinness primarily as a response to contemporary popular culture (e.g. fashion), Giordano argues that "thinness does not have much to do with what we believe to be nice or beautiful -- it is not simply a matter of what we find pretty. It is a matter of what we believe to be good and right" (104). Eating disorders are not "the symptom of an underlying mental disorder, as is often argued. They are the symptoms of ordinary morality, which is just being taken seriously -- or more seriously than usual" (257).

Giordano makes an enormously serious claim, one that stands as an indictment of the substance of western morality. Obviously she is not the first to have launched such a critique -- though she may be the first to use an analysis of eating disorders as the pathway to it.

If we really want to understand eating disorders, and to understand what it is right to do with eating-disordered people, we do not need to focus on how people eat, but rather to look at what they believe, and more generally at what we all believe -- at our morality. (263)

I find this claim extremely compelling, and potentially extremely promising. I do not think her book offers sufficient evidence -- philosophical or otherwise -- to support it.

At the outset, Giordano specifically rejects one source of support for this claim. She asserts that she will not "compare eating disorders to other forms of food refusal -- medieval ascetic saints, for example… ." (2). While I appreciate her desire to focus on the particularities of contemporary eating disorders, I believe fruitful links could have been drawn between contemporary disordered eaters and earlier fasting women. Illustrations of the ways in which earlier "non-eaters" sometimes understood their behavior as a way to adhere to the strictures of Christian morality could help corroborate Giordano's claim that understanding eating disorders requires understanding western morality. Given her interest in showing the value that western (Christian) morality has long placed upon lightness, it seems quite paradoxical for her to refuse to explore connections between contemporary manifestations of this value and other, historical manifestations, such as those discussed in Caroline Walker Bynum's Holy Feast, Holy Fast, or Joan Jacob Brumberg's Fasting Girls.[1]

Giordano's second project -- a thoughtful, multi-layered analysis of the autonomy of persons with eating disorders -- is more successful because more thoroughly argued. She considers, and rejects, the received view that persons with an eating disorder are, by definition, incapable of genuine autonomy. Instead, she argues that their autonomy -- which she takes to be synonymous with competence, and which she recommends we understand using a "functional" approach rather than an "outcome" approach -- must be assessed on a case-by-case basis. (See 49 and 189 for a discussion of functional versus outcome approaches.) On her view, there is nothing, in principle, to preclude the possibility that the eating disordered person is genuinely capable of making autonomous decisions about her own life (and death) choices.

Giordano takes this autonomy claim to its quite disturbing conclusion. She argues that, should a person with an eating disorder be recognized to be capable of making autonomous decisions regarding her care, carers may be required to accept her decision to refuse life-saving treatment. Giordano calls this the "brave claim":

people with anorexia nervosa who competently decide not to be artificially fed should be respected because everybody is entitled to the exercise of their autonomy … when their own life is at stake. (246)

Her argument does not stop here, however.

While the brave claim may be consistent, coherent, and defensible in some cases, there are "other important considerations to make that arguably 'weaken' the normative strength of the principle of respect for autonomy" (249). That is, autonomy (as she has conceived it) is not the only relevant factor carers need consider. In the case of an eating disorder, she notes that it is particularly relevant that the person with the disorder need not die -- that her death is entirely avoidable. Loved ones will find the avoidable death of the person with anorexia quite literally unbearable; Giordano argues that, while their potential sorrow should not outweigh the autonomy of the individual in all cases, it is "ethically relevant" (249; her emphasis). In the end, it may turn out that Giordano would condone force-feeding in just those cases in which a person who denied the autonomy of disordered eaters would do so. Even if this were the case, however, the differences in their reasons for justifying force-feeding are significant; Giordano's "weak paternalism" approach exhibits greater respect both for persons with eating disorders and for those attempting to care for them.

Her desire to acknowledge the limits of autonomy gives rise to another of the conceptual limitations I find in Giordano's approach. Regarding the matter of gender, Giordano commits herself to a position that, in the end, is both paradoxical and limiting to her thesis. She asserts, early on, that she will undertake this investigation without consideration of feminist theory, because she does not wish to "consider eating disorders… as a 'women's' issue… " (2). This position is paradoxical, insofar as it requires her to perform some conceptual gymnastics, in an effort to account for the fact that the majority of those diagnosed with eating disorders are in fact women, but to do so in a way that doesn't make it "a women's issue" (a concept she seems to take in a very narrow and reductionist sense). The position is limiting, insofar as it precludes her from considering theoretical accounts -- including accounts of autonomy -- that would support her own most favorably.

In rejecting feminist theory as a source for understanding eating disorders, Giordano actually seems to have in mind only feminist psychological analyses of eating disorders per se. Giordano appears not to consider the possibility that feminist philosophy might offer her a great deal, in the way of supporting theoretical and conceptual material. By this I mean not only feminist philosophy specifically examining the matter of eating disorders.[2] Feminist analyses of autonomy that emerge from the work of Lorraine Code, Catriona MacKenzie and Natalie Stoljar, and Marilyn Friedman would also be of considerable use to her in her efforts to address the autonomy of persons with eating disorders.[3] In particular, the notion of "relational autonomy," which, as the name suggests, understands individuals' autonomy as being constituted in part through one's relations with others, could go far in helping Giordano make a case for weak paternalism that would not require compromising patients' autonomy, but could rather understand autonomy as also involving the needs, hopes and desires of those with whom the patient has relationships. According to a relational understanding of autonomy, one does not understand the autonomy of the eating disordered person over against the wishes of her family and friends, but, rather, as including those wishes (albeit in a complex way).

In short, while I do not mean to suggest that feminist theory is sufficient unto itself as an account of eating disorders, and while I wholeheartedly concur that various feminist psychological accounts of these disorders have been incomplete, misleading, and problematic in other ways, I nevertheless believe that Giordano is depriving her theory of important explanatory elements by refusing to discuss and utilize feminist theories -- particularly feminist philosophical theories. Her desire not to create a feminist account leaves her short-sightedly resistant to using any feminist or gender theories whatsoever.

In addition to rejecting these philosophical resources, which could prove particularly helpful for her, Giordano also exhibits a certain randomness and lack of systematization in her use and application of other philosophical theories. To mention just one instance, a discussion of belief suddenly mentions Charles Peirce's theory of belief. The reference seems rather more gratuitous than substantive; her account is not a pragmatist one, nor does she make any other references to Peirce. Wittgenstein is invoked at a single point in the conclusion, in a passage in which she suggests that, just as he argued one must "throw away the ladder" of the Tractatus, once one has understood it, so too must "the perspective from which eating disorders are normally observed… be surpassed" (263). Instances such as these make the book a bit frustrating reading for a philosopher, chiefly because one is left unclear about the philosophical tradition in which she intends to situate the work.

Regarding her use of philosophy, I must note that her primary aim is not to produce an original philosophical thesis, but rather to use the resources of philosophy to make an argument about how persons with eating disorders ought to be treated -- by their caregivers and by the law. (In describing the role of philosophy thus, I believe my description is more in keeping with Giordano's own, than is the description found on the dust jacket; it describes the book as "the first full philosophical study of ethical issues in the treatment of anorexia and bulimia nervosa.") Giordano draws upon a host of theorists to develop her account of autonomy, and to explore the western "value of lightness." Her discussion of autonomy uses the work of canonical figures such as Kant and Mill, and contemporary theorists such as Rawls and Gerald Dworkin, to develop a general account of the nature of autonomy. Seen in this light, her summary discussions of rather large sweeps of the philosophical terrain are understandable. Nevertheless, I would reiterate that the case for her own claims could have been more strongly made, had she drawn upon different philosophical resources to make them. In particular, her indictment of western morality -- the most specifically philosophical task she undertakes -- would benefit from a reading of philosophers who have themselves endeavored to challenge the projects of western morality.

Giordano writes in a manner that strives to take account of her audience -- in which category she particularly seeks to include those caring for persons with eating disorders. She does so by carefully defining technical concepts she uses, not presuming that readers will be familiar with philosophical theories of the self, or aspects of British law. She also "signposts" her argument liberally, reminding readers of where they encountered ideas earlier, and where a particular argument will be picked up.

These signposts turn out to be indispensable, because the overall structure of the book is not particularly easy to follow, nor does it best follow the structure of the argument itself. Not infrequently, I found myself brought to the culmination of a particular line of argumentation, only to be told that the much-anticipated conclusion was to be held off for a few chapters while we returned to analyze some criticisms that had arisen along the way. Giordano seems not fully to have resolved the matter of how to weave together critiques of existing analyses of eating disorders with the development of her original thesis. The result is a rather anticlimactic and (at times) confusing structure. Chapters 7 through 10 illustrate this tendency particularly vividly. Chapters 7 and 8 summarize certain received clinical descriptions of persons with eating disorders, and 9 goes on to begin to move beyond these accounts to answer two crucial "why" questions -- a development we expect to be continued in the next chapter. Instead, Chapter 10 abruptly takes us back to the material of Chapters 8 and 9, to construct a critique of those received accounts.

Regarding argument structure more generally, while the assiduous reader can come to understand how various chapters develop her central claims, I believe those claims could have been made more forcefully if the structure of the work were tighter and more coherent. The book's introduction and conclusion attempt to achieve this tightness by providing summaries of each chapter, and by showing their place in the overall argument. While they are helpful, these synopses cannot replace the need for a clearer structure overall.

Giordano's prose style is readable, if rather formulaic. Frequent repetitions are unfortunately distracting. (Entire sentences are sometimes repeated -- sometimes only a page apart from each other.) Her use of illustrations from literature and the arts, as well as autobiographical accounts from persons with eating disorders, ground the work in ways that will be helpful for practitioners who wish to use the book in their work.

[1] Caroline Walker Bynum, Holy Feast and Holy Fast: The Religious Significance of Food to Medieval Women (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1988); Joan Jacobs Brumberg, Fasting Girls: The History of Anorexia Nervosa (New York: Vintage, 2000).

[2] The best known -- and arguably most important -- work in this category is Susan Bordo's Unbearable Weight (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1993).

[3] Lorraine Code, What Can She Know? Feminist Theory and the Construction of Knowledge (Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 1991); Catriona Mackenzie and Natalie Stoljar, eds., Relational Autonomy: Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy, Agency, and the Social Self (Oxford University Press, 2000); Marilyn Friedman, Autonomy, Gender, Politics (Oxford University Press, 2003).