Understanding Ethical Failures in Leadership

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Terry L. Price, Understanding Ethical Failures in Leadership, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 240pp, $24.99 (pbk) ISBN 0521545978.

Reviewed by Edwin M. Hartman, Rutgers University


To think of oneself as a leader is to see oneself as a special person with special obligations that others do not have. These obligations, related to the goals and interests of the group that one leads, also license certain actions that the leader may take but others may not. So leaders characteristically make exceptions for themselves, exemptions from generally accepted moral standards, and they sometimes do so justifiably. But sometimes they get it wrong, and are guilty of ethical failure. Terry Price claims that these ethical failures in leaders are typically cognitive rather than volitional, a matter of false belief rather than bad desire. He particularly opposes the view that leaders characteristically go wrong in acting selfishly because, having great power, they can get away with it.

To be morally justified it is not enough for leaders to put collective interests ahead of their own interests, for self-interestedness is not the problem. It is just because leaders are characteristically oriented to the ends that they share with their followers that they face cognitive challenges, which are of two sorts. First, they may fail to note the ethical constraints on the means they use to achieve their ends. Second, they may ignore the interests of parties outside their group of followers.

On the volitional account, moral failure is about knowing what is right and not doing it; on the cognitive account, it is a matter of being mistaken either about the content of some moral requirement or about its scope. Price associates the volitional account with egoism primarily, but he acknowledges that a leader might cast aside moral constraints for the good of the group as well as for selfish reasons. He argues that leaders in particular typically go wrong not because they want to use their position to take advantage of their followers, but precisely because they are committed to the intrinsic value of group ends and therefore believe that goal achievement justifies moral costs to followers and outsiders. Moral failures in leadership are typically cognitive failures related to scope: the erring leader fails to see that some moral requirement that applies to the rest of us also applies to him. (Price normally uses the masculine pronoun, since most failed leaders are men.) Or he may fail to take the interests of those outside the group sufficiently seriously. So, for example, the framers of the Declaration of Independence had all too little difficulty in sincerely holding that all men are created equal at the same time that they held slaves.

Presumably a leader can be selfish, as anyone can be; that is a typical volitional problem. It would strain credulity to claim that leaders rarely take selfish advantage of the perks associated with the position because they can get away with it. But Price argues that it is characteristic of leaders to act in the interests of their followers, or of the community or organization that they lead, and they make cognitive mistakes in so doing.

Price makes it easier to accept the cognitive view of moral failure by taking a kind of Aristotelian view of acting immorally: he seems to find it odd to say that one might do something that one knows is wrong but just not care very much. Is it really so odd? To claim that I ought to do something but that my obligation has no normative force for me may take some explaining, but it is not a self-evidently impossible position. Rationalization and other phenomena do suggest the force of moral considerations, but they fail to show that one cannot deliberately do what one knows is wrong for selfish reasons. Still, Price argues acutely against facile tendencies to attribute much of human behavior to self-interest.

Price has remarkably little to say about rationalization; the word does not appear in his index. Surely he can afford to concede that moral failure in leaders is often not purely cognitive. In fact, as the likes of Kahneman and Twersky, along with generations of social psychologists, have shown, much that appears to be cognitive is not purely so. When people make exceptions for themselves it is often because in some way it serves their interests to do so. The odious leaders of North Korea could easily state a rationale for the extravagant expenditures on their own glorification despite the desperate state of their economy. Perhaps in some obscure sense the current Dear Leader, Kim Sung Il, really believes that the morale of his people requires that he be maintained in sybaritic luxury. Price cites politicians who argue that their graft is the just reward for their labors on behalf of their constituents. As Hamlet quite appropriately said to Gertrude, so we might say: "Lay not that flattering unction to your soul."

Price describes how President Clinton, one of his favorite examples of inappropriate exception-making, used to show up hours late for events and once apparently stopped traffic at the Los Angeles airport to have a haircut. It is not clear that this is anything more than doing what he can get away with. A mind as fertile as Clinton's could probably conjure up a statement that the demands of his position of leadership made his behavior permissible or even necessary, but it would be a pseudo-reason. Churchill, reproved for rudeness to a secretary, replied, "But I am a great man!" Was this a cognitive error? These cases look like powerful people getting away with it because they can, as rude police officers do. It would not greatly damage Price's overall argument to acknowledge that some excuses do not work even as fig leaves. He mentions Jim Bakker, the televangelist who cheated his followers, whose errors were volitional, but he is not writing a book about people like that, for theirs is not the kind of immorality to which leaders are particularly susceptible. He does not need to show that the volitional account of wrongdoing is bankrupt or that leaders' errors are purely cognitive. What he needs to do he does: he shows that the moral problems that characteristically bedevil leaders tend to involve faulty cognition, particularly about the scope of moral principles, rather than just bad volition. This does not require him to suggest, as he does, that greed was not Dennis Koslowski's primary motivation.

Price is convincing when he argues that in the absence of greed and other self-regarding motivators there will still be problems about leadership. Transformational leadership, for all its emphasis on the other-regarding motivation of the leader who seeks to get people to live up to their authentic values, is still subject to inappropriate exception-making for oneself. One can sincerely invoke the better angels of our nature, as Lincoln did, and still cut corners inappropriately. Price treats transformational leadership more respectfully, perhaps, than it deserves to be treated. There is surely something dangerous about undertaking to give people what one believes that they deeply value rather than what they say they want.

Price is clear in saying that a leader's cognitive error is moral error. Leaders are morally responsible for their cognitive misjudgments. Here too he seems to follow Aristotle, who holds that ethics requires correct cognition. Some ignorance (or irrationality) is part of bad character, Aristotle would say; the ability to size up a situation correctly is a sign of good character (NE III 5 1114a31ff.). Aristotle does not say that one chooses to be irrational -- or for that matter greedy or cowardly -- but he does say that one is responsible for one's character.

Price suggests that what distinguishes a leader from someone who is simply in a position of authority is that the leader accepts the interests of the followers (which of course the leader may characterize in an insane way) as an important motivating factor. That might distinguish a leader from a mere manager or political officeholder, and it would suggest that true leaders' mistakes tend to be cognitive ones. So Hitler was apparently not narrowly selfish: his evil was primarily a matter of the way in which he dehumanized those who were not within the scope of his beloved Volk. He did not engage in mass murder because it was fun and he thought he had so much power that he could get away with it. William Marcy Tweed, on the other hand, seems to have been in it for the money, and in that sense he was not a leader of the constituents of Tammany Hall. Arafat would fall somewhere between them: presumably graft for him was not the reason for being chairman of the PLO, but he probably rationalized his greedy behavior by telling himself and others that it was his due, and of course he had little concern for those beyond his group, to put it mildly. So if we are talking about true leaders, then it does make sense to deemphasize the volitional sort of error, the kind that Boss Tweed makes, and to focus on the cognitive sort, of which Hitler is a good example when he makes unjustified exceptions for himself in abandoning accepted moral principles -- in particular, when he makes the worst possible mistake in narrowing the scope of humanity to exclude Jews and others. But while personal greed probably did not motivate Hitler, it is not the only form that egoism takes. Price has surprisingly little to say about the appetite for power, which surely moved Hitler and other tyrants, who could then justify their behavior by claiming that the situation called for strong measures. It is hard to see that Hitler's problem was simply cognitive. He had a pathological hatred of Jews, and rationalized his hatred by creating a story about how they were what was wrong with the world. That he believed this bizarre story was not a purely cognitive difficulty.

So leadership creates problems about exceptions for leaders, but what are leaders supposed to do about this problem? It is extraordinarily difficult to figure out exactly when one is justified in ignoring the standard obligation as inapplicable and how far beyond it one should go. Leaders must justify their deviation from the requirements that apply to the rest of us by reference to good reasons. What gives them the right? And what right do they have?

The difficulty of these questions is the key to answering them, Price claims. Leaders must make exceptions for themselves with their epistemic fallibility in mind. In the context of a discussion of Huck Finn's famous deliberations about whether to turn his friend Jim over to those who are hunting him, Price argues against taking one's emotions -- sympathy, for example -- as a guide to action. A better behavioral check is what he calls moral inclusiveness. It is by no means always wrong to give priority to the interests of those whom one leads, but it is always wrong to fail to recognize the humanity of those outside one's community. In search of further behavioral checks Price provides the example of the writings and actions of Martin Luther King in civil disobedience. There the behavioral checks, necessary conditions of the justification of civil disobedience, were publicity, non-violence, and willingness to accept the legal penalty for breaking the law. But these three conditions are not necessary conditions for the justification of exceptions, because there are some cases, such as violently repressive regimes, in which one could not justifiably demand that they be met. The moral inclusiveness condition, on the other hand, is necessary, though it does not always rule out acting against the interests of some (e.g., civilians collaterally damaged) outside one's community.

Price concludes by arguing that today's leaders should accommodate their epistemic shortcomings with an eye on the judgment of future generations. They have an advantage that leaders of previous eras did not have: they know their epistemic limitations and the terrible consequences of ignoring them. They should lead with an eye on history; in particular, they should bias their actions towards more inclusiveness of those at the margins of their communities, and beyond. The failure to do this was the greatest moral error of their predecessors.

The book covers a lot of ground. Some readers may believe that Price occasionally follows an argument into a bit more detail than is strictly necessary, as for example when he discusses Martin Luther King on civil disobedience or Michael Walzer on dirty hands. He can never be accused of irrelevance, however, and in any case his excursions are nearly always acute and interesting. One nice example is in Chapter 3, where Price discusses the kinds of exception-making associated with three approaches to leadership -- trait, situational, and transactional. In considering the first of these he makes some astute observations about the dangers of overconfidence that beset virtue ethics.

One of the impressive features of this book is the author's ability to address issues of both moral philosophy and organization theory at a high level of sophistication, whereas business ethics has tended to divide into those who do the one or the other. Better still, he pulls them usefully together, as when he raises objections to Locke's views on self-interest. I hope and believe that Price represents the bright future of the field of business ethics.