Understanding, Explanation, and Scientific Knowledge

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Kareem Khalifa, Understanding, Explanation, and Scientific Knowledge, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 252pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107195636.

Reviewed by Petri Ylikoski, University of Helsinki


Some 20 years ago, understanding was not an important philosophical concept outside philosophy of the human sciences. The word appeared sometimes in texts related to scientific explanation, but it was not a topic of systematic attention. A lot has happened since. Epistemologists and philosophers of science have put forward theories about understanding. Kareem Khalifa's book is an attempt to take stock of the current scene. His approach is relatively conservative as he sets out to defend what he calls the received view on understanding. According to it, understanding consists of knowledge of relevant explanatory information. Basically, the book is an extended argument against various attempts to challenge the received view.

Khalifa's defense is based on his Explanation-Knowledge-Science (EKS) model of understanding. The model is based on the following four ideas. First, understanding comes in degrees. Consider that it is possible to more or less understand something, and also that we can compare how well different people understand a given phenomenon or fact. Second, the amount of understanding a person has reflects how completely she grasps the explanatory nexus related to p (the explanandum). Khalifa defines the explanatory nexus as the set of correct explanations of p and the relations between those explanations. The completeness of a grasp will vary with respect to the number, importance, and detail of the grasped explanations and inter-explanatory relations. Third, grasping is defined as the cognitive state bearing resemblance to the scientific knowledge of the part of explanatory nexus. Thus, one person understands p better than another if her grasp of the explanatory nexus bears greater resemblance to the scientific knowledge of the matter.

Finally, to rule out accidental resemblances, Khalifa requires that a person's explanatory knowledge is based on scientific explanatory evaluation (SEE). This has three features: a) consideration, the person should consider multiple plausible alternative explanations; b) comparison, the person should compare the competing explanations using best scientific methods and evidence; and c) belief-formation, the person's doxastic attitudes should be guided by the mentioned explanatory comparisons. These principles give rise to measures that can be used to judge the resemblance between a person's understanding and the scientific knowledge: 1) the number of plausible alternative explanations the person has considered; 2) the number of explanations that have been compared employing scientific criteria; 3) the scientific status of criteria used in the comparison, 4) the safety of the person's beliefs about explanations; 5) the accuracy of the person's beliefs about explanations, and 6) the variety of ways in which the person can employ explanatory information to achieve scientific goals.

The book has eight chapters. The basic ideas of the ESK model are presented in Chapter 1. Chapter 2 illustrates the model using a discussion of Bjorken scaling in Physics and comparing the ESK model to Henk de Regt's well-known account of understanding. Chapter 3 takes up the relation between understanding and ability. Khalifa defends the position according to which both understanding and knowledge require the same abilities, thus blocking a popular strategy used to separate understanding and knowing explanatory information. His argumentative strategy is two-fold. He begins by arguing that knowing an explanation requires some abilities, and then proceeds to show that these are the same as required for understanding in the ESK model. Chapter 4 discusses the awkwardly named issue of objectual understanding. This notion refers basically to mastery of some subject matter. Khalifa argues that objectual understanding does not require more than explanatory understanding, but simply an abundance of explanatory understanding. Accordingly, the ESK model can cope with intuitions rising from objectual understanding.

Peter Lipton's provocative claim that there can be understanding without explanation is the topic of Chapter 5. Khalifa reconstructs Lipton's defense of this claim in great detail and argues that none of the considerations he raises poses a challenge for the ESK model. To deal with intuitions that make Lipton's argument appealing, he introduces the notion of proto-understanding. A person has proto-understanding when she does not yet have proper understanding, but does have some grasp of the explanatory role of some piece of explanatory information. Furthermore, he argues, contrary to Lipton, that explanations do not have to be linguistic. This makes room for "tacit" understanding that still counts as explanatory understanding. Khalifa's critical discussion is valuable, as it has become a commonplace to take Lipton's arguments at face value.

Chapter 6 tackles the relation between understanding and true belief. Non-factivists, according to whom understanding why p does not require belief in true (or approximately true) explanations of p, pose a challenge. Their arguments come in two forms. First, there is the historical argument that points to examples of past scientists who believed in false theories but nevertheless seemed to have some understanding of the phenomenon. Second, there are arguments that suggest that while idealized theories are literally untrue, they are still important source of understanding in science. In both cases, Khalifa argues that it is possible to treat these cases selectively, or to appeal to proto-understanding, so that the ESK model is saved.

Chapter 7 discusses the compatibility of luck and understanding. Khalifa argues that while some understanding might be lucky, this does not constitute a problem for the ESK model, because SEE principles guarantee that luck diminishes understanding. Finally, Chapter 8 considers whether knowledge and understanding have the same kind of epistemic value. According to Khalifa, explanatory improvements expand our true beliefs, so better understanding is associated with at least one fundamental epistemic good. Furthermore, the three SEE principles -- consideration, comparison, and belief-formation -- are associated with explanatory improvement. In other words, understanding is safely connected with cognitive achievement and epistemic value.

I read this book as a naturalistic philosopher of science interested in explanation. I confess that I have always been doubtful of the relevance of analytical epistemology for philosophy of science. I think Khalifa's book demonstrates this with respect to theories of understanding. (I don't know if he himself would agree with this.) However, I am happy that somebody has worked through the literature.

From the point of view of philosophy of science, I found Khalifa's account a bit too abstract. He does not have much to say about explanation, and even less about inter-explanatory relationships although these are key elements in his account. His argumentative strategy is to let the reader fill in her preferred account of explanation, as the EKS model should be acceptable whatever one thinks about scientific realism or about the characteristics that determine the explanatory relevance. This might be a prudent argumentative strategy in epistemological debates, but it leaves the theory highly abstract. For example, it makes it impossible to consider things like (theoretical or practical) trade-offs between different dimensions of explanatory goodness, or various relations between explanations. Furthermore, a minimal theory of explanation also limits how much one can say about understanding. A shallow theory of explanation implies a thin theory of understanding.

Another drawback of using epistemological question-setting to defend the received view about understanding is that Khalifa seems to miss two major reasons why the notion of understanding is interesting at all. First, there is the metacognitive role of understanding. It seems that some kind of sense (or feeling) of understanding has an important regulative role in our cognitive lives. It tells us when we need acquire more knowledge and when we have enough understanding to provide an explanation. While this sense of understanding and understanding analyzed by Khalifa are different things, it would be a mistake to dismiss it as a mere false belief about understanding. While our sense of understanding might be badly calibrated, it is a crucial feature of our cognition. Once one starts to think about it, it is very hard to imagine any advanced cognitive system that would manage without metacognition. However, contemporary epistemology and philosophy of science almost completely miss this dimension of our cognition. For this reason, Khalifa's quick dismissal of phenomenology of understanding is a wasted opportunity. Not only understanding, but also illusory understanding requires philosophical analysis.

The second missed aspect of understanding concerns its objects. We understand both scientific representations (theories, models, graphs, etc.) and phenomena with the help of those representations. Understanding theories and other scientific representations right is a major challenge that is not just another colloquial use of the word understanding. It is a crucial element of understanding phenomena in the world. Without these representations we would have not much understanding at all. Furthermore, the question is not just understanding true theories, the real challenge of understanding phenomena with scientific representations is to get the relation between the representation and the intended object right. Again, a crucial element of our cognition associated with understanding that is missed by Khalifa's account.

I am not arguing that Khalifa's account cannot accommodate these things or that they constitute an argument against the received view. To the contrary, I think they are (in principle) compatible with his ideas. They also are issues that make the notion of understanding genuinely interesting. Furthermore, these two "ambiguities" of understanding could help to explain intuitions behind some of the views Khalifa attempts to debunk in his book.