Understanding Faith: Religious Belief and its Place in Society

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Stephen R. L. Clark, Understanding Faith: Religious Belief and its Place in Society, Academic Imprint, 2009, 280pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845401542.

Reviewed by David Basinger, Roberts Wesleyan College



This book is advertised as a philosophical discussion of religious belief and its place in society. For the most part this description is accurate. However, at times Clark strays. For example, his discussion of the sense in which animals can be our friends (chapter 5) is primarily a very interesting philosophical analysis of “friendship,” with only cursory acknowledgement of the conceptualizations of animals in religious and general societal thought. And while Clark’s lengthy, detailed comparative discussion of the status of objective values in Platonic, Stoic, and Epicurean thought (chapter 4) is of inherent interest, the discussion seems excessive and tangential, given the book’s stated focus. In general, though, Clark keeps the focus on the nature of faith (religious belief) and its function in/impact on society.

Occasionally, the discussion centers on Clark’s own analysis of aspects of this faith-society relationship. For example, chapter 10 is a very interesting, nuanced presentation of his views on faith-based education and the appropriate role of religious values in our societal understanding of sex and war.

The book is not, though, primarily a sustained explication of Clark’s own understanding of faith and its place in society. By his own admission, the impetus for this book was Clark’s exasperation with what he labels militant atheism. Casual atheists, we are told, are those who have merely “lost interest in the thought of gods.” Militant atheists, on the other hand, are those who “wish to eradicate such thoughts, whether by making speeches or, if they have the power, outlawing everything they think ‘religious’” (5). They routinely identify religious believers as bigots and are "like missionaries in thinking … that their own state of mind is obviously right" (6). Clark’s primary goal in this book is to counter-attack such atheists. That is, while we do learn much about Clark’s own views on faith and its place in society, Clark’s primary purpose is to defend religious belief and the acknowledged desire of religious believers to retain religious values in societal activity from militant atheistic criticism.

Probably most troubling to Clark is the fundamental assumption he believes undergirds all that militant atheists say and do: that they are curious, open-minded, and willing to admit when they are proved wrong by an objective analysis of the relevant facts while “all religious believers are complacent, prejudiced, credulous of ecclesiastical authority, and incorrigibly ignorant” (34). But this is simply “silly,” we are told (34). All truth claims, whether “scientific” or “religious,” are based on metaphysical and ethical assumptions about the nature of reality that cannot themselves be “proved” in a non-question-begging manner and thus, in a very real sense, all truth claims are based on faith — i.e., are based on a “firm persuasion” that one’s view of reality is right (50).

Clark also repeatedly argues that militant atheists don’t (don’t want to?) have a clear, accurate understanding of the religious beliefs they so fervently attack. For example, as he sees it, militant atheists are wrong to assume that all or most religious believers employ a literal reading of their sacred texts and must, therefore, answer for the seemingly inaccurate and/or inconsistent statements these texts contain. Sophisticated believers have long realized that religious “scriptures need to be interpreted as a whole, and within an appropriate oral tradition” (62) and, accordingly, that what they are intended to learn may be true “even if ‘historical’ inferences that have sometimes been drawn from its record are — sometimes — inaccurate” or the literal language not self-consistent (64).

Another example of this type of doctrinal misrepresentation, from Clark’s perspective, is the misguided assumption by militant atheists that religion is anti-evolutionary. There are, Clark points out, actually three related but distinct evolutionary claims about life on our planet: (1) “that biological history reaches back for many millions of years,” (2) that creatures, past and present, are genetically related, and (3) that “undirected variation and natural selection are together enough to explain the past and present diversity of living creatures” (126). The first two are seen as rather uncontroversially true. For example, it is nearly universally held by educated believers, Clark maintains, that “God may as easily create the world by evolutionary stages as by discrete, creative actions” (125). However, he sees the third claim in a different light. “That we have evolved, and that we are cousins of all living creatures … are both very likely true” (157). But the further contention that natural selection and random variation must alone be responsible is not a confirmed hypothesis but rather a naturalistic assumption based on the question-begging metaphysical belief that there can be no supernatural reality (148-157).

Yet another example of such doctrinal misrepresentation, as Clark sees it, is the confused assumption by militant atheists (and many analytic philosophers of religion) that to believe in God is to affirm a certain set of properties, as this abstracts God from the common understanding and practice of believers (172). Once we realize that the stories about God told in sacred texts need not be taken to tell us straightforward truths, we are in a better position to understand what is really being said about God. For example, we are told, the question of what it means for God to be omnipotent has nothing to do with such questions as whether God can create a stone that God cannot lift. To say that God is omnipotent is to say with the author of Romans that “nothing in all creation … can separate us from the love of God” (174). And to say God is omniscient is not to make a claim about God’s infallible knowledge of all future events. It is to say that “nothing is hidden from God” (175).

Another key focus of Clark’s critique of militant atheists is what he sees as the very dubious normative foundation on which their attacks on religion are based and the unintended (and normally unacknowledged) consequences of this normative position. The fact that militant atheists can feel such rage, Clark points out, is homage to the fact that they believe there to be real, objective values against which they can judge religion and find it wanting. However, if militant atheists are correct in assuming that we exist in a closed, evolved natural system, he continues, then there can be no transcendent values — no real, objective values — on which we can make objective normative judgments. The basis for judgment, rather, is reduced to personal taste or private whims (165-172; 182-194). But if this is so, then mercy and justice, for example, are not the objective values militant atheists assume them to be so these atheists can’t justifiably use these concepts to make the critique of religion that they believe should be persuasive to all open-mined, rational individuals (184).

Furthermore, Clark argues, if there really are no objective values, then we will need to rethink as humans our purpose and sense of meaning (165-171; 214-226; 262-269). For instance, if we reject objective values — if judgment really does come down to personal taste and private whims — then we leave each nation to function as those in power wish it to function, and we have little reason to assume that those in power will make the decisions we think best either now or in the future (223-226). Also, if there are no objective values — “no strict norms, no fixed boundaries” (265) — to mark the way as we go, it’s hard to see what it could even mean to talk about the world becoming a “better” place over time in the sense that “justice” will prevail.

Moreover, Clark concludes, these serious normative issues are not something to which militant atheists have given an adequate response; most don’t even realize or acknowledge the problem.

There is much in Clark’s critique of militant atheism with which I agree. I believe Clark is right, for instance, in claiming that militant atheists such as Richard Dawkins and Daniel Dennett often attack very simplified and at times simplistic characterizations of religious believers and their beliefs. Clark, in his “exasperation,” at times implies not only that these atheists should know better but that they do know better but purposely choose to ignore what they know to make their case. But regardless of why this is so, such atheists do tend to characterize religious believers en masse as “complacent, prejudiced, credulous and incorrigibly ignorant” when it’s clearly the case that the religious perspectives they are attacking have adherents who are at the very least as credentialed, curious, and open-minded as these militant atheists believe themselves to be. And such atheists do tend to imply that the religious beliefs they attack are the “standard beliefs” held by the vast majority of “actual believers” when there is in fact tremendous diversity of thought not only among various religions but within any given religious tradition itself.

I also think that Clark’s critique of the normative basis on which militant atheists mount their attacks is important and insightful. The question of whether objective values — ethical principles that retain their truth value regardless of the whims and tastes of particular individuals or groups of individuals — are possible in a closed naturalistic system where all such principles are ultimately the product of human thought is not new. And it’s not as if various responses have not been offered, responses that are deemed satisfactory by atheists of the type in question. However, I’ve never found these responses totally adequate. If it is in fact true that the basic ethical principles most of us affirm (and to which militant atheists appeal) are the product of the minds of a contingent set of evolved animals in a closed naturalistic system, then it’s difficult for me to see how these principles don’t in some sense reduce to the feelings (sympathies, intuitions) of the majority of those evolved animals currently in control and thus difficult for me to understand why we should not expect the set of basic ethical principles to which we appeal to change as the set of contingent evolved animals making these “ethical” decisions changes.

There are, however, a couple of aspects of Clark’s critique of militant atheism with which I’m not in full agreement. While I’ve already stated that I agree with Clark that militant atheists fail to acknowledge the nuanced diversity of religious beliefs, Clark implies at times that few believers today hold the types of beliefs that militant atheists primarily attack. Clark maintains, for example, that few thoughtful (sophisticated) Christian believers today interpret the Bible literally or question that our universe is billions of years old and that biological history stretches back for millions of years. However, this strikes me as overly reductionistic. It is certainly true that many current Christian believers do in their reading of scripture distinguish intended meaning from historic and scientific accuracy and accept evolution as God’s creative tool. Furthermore, it might be argued that all should do so. However, given my own experience and reading, it seems to me inaccurate to say that most or even the majority of serious, thoughtful believers have rejected a literal reading of Scripture or have accepted an evolutionary understanding of creation. Accordingly, I don’t think that militant atheists can be faulted for targeting such believers (even if they can rightly be faulted for focusing only on such believers).

My other problem is with Clark’s claim that philosophical discussions about the nature of God’s attributes — e.g., the nature of God’s power and knowledge — have little relevance to the manner in which actual believers understand and live out their faith. As someone who has been discussing God’s attributes in both classroom and church settings with a wide variety of actual believers for well over thirty years, I disagree. It may well be true that some classic philosophical puzzles about God’s nature — e.g., the question of whether an omnipotent being can create a stone this being cannot lift — have little relevance for the lives of actual believers. But I’ve found that most actual believers frequently base their explanations for what has occurred and what they see as proper behavior on assumptions about the extent to which God controls what occurs and/or the perceived extent of God’s knowledge and their ability to access this knowledge. The only real question is whether their assumptions about the nature of God’s power and knowledge have been recognized and evaluated. And I’ve found that most believers welcome the opportunity to review the various options open to them and make their personal beliefs on these important issues their own.

Overall, though, I found this book to be an insightful discussion of the nature of religious belief in a societal context. I especially recommend it for those who have been uneasy with the current attacks on religion by militant atheists, as I believe Clark has done an excellent job of identifying and challenging some of the assumptions on which these attacks are based.