Understanding Foucault, Understanding Modernism

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David Scott (ed.), Understanding Foucault, Understanding Modernism, Bloomsbury, 2017, 265pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781628927702.

Reviewed by Corey McCall, Elmira College


This edited collection is the third volume in a series that examines key philosophers' work in relationship to modernism. As stated in the series preface, the goal is to make key writings of each thinker accessible while also relating their works to modernism. Each volume in the series has three sections: a first, which focuses on "conceptualizing" the volume's philosopher, a second "on aesthetics, which "maps connections between modernist works and the philosophical figure," while the final section consists of brief essays on key terms relevant for understanding the philosopher's relationship to modernism (vii). In theory, this structure should appeal to a wide audience, for readers less familiar with Foucault will find the first and third sections helpful for understanding his key works and concepts, while readers more familiar with Foucault's writings will find the essays in the second section valuable. In practice, it means that only the essays in the second section provide a sustained engagement with the volume's purported theme. Indeed, all the essays in the second section do engage Foucault and modernism, and they approach Foucault's work in novel ways, particularly those essays that juxtapose Foucault's work with that of unexpected authors such as John Dos Passos and Gertrude Stein. As I read the essays in the first section I kept wondering when I was going to find essays devoted to Foucault and modernism, though my patience was amply rewarded with the essays in the second section. The final section consists of ten brief essays elucidating key terms which are presumably important for understanding the essays in the preceding two sections and for understanding Foucault and modernism more generally, terms such as "archaeology," "the 'author-function,'" "episteme," and "biopower." Like the essays in the initial part, these brief glossary essays are useful for reference but fail to really tell readers much about possible intersections between Foucault and modernism.

This is not to say that the essays in the first part are without value. Indeed, I could see assigning any of the six essays that comprise this section as supplementary reading in an undergraduate course devoted to Foucault's work. For example, Heath Massey's "Archaeology of Knowledge: Foucault and the Time of Discourse" is a lucid analysis of a notoriously difficult text, and thus serves as an admirable introduction to this work. Similarly, Chloë Taylor's "Foucault's The History of Sexuality" deftly contextualizes the first volume of The History of Sexuality both in terms of Foucault's lecture courses and in terms of Foucault's legacy as it is debated in contemporary fields such as gender studies and disability studies. Like Taylor's essay, Christopher Penfield offers a reading of Discipline and Punish in "Carceral, Capital, Power: The 'Dark Side' of the Enlightenment in Discipline and Punish" that situates Foucault's text relative to Marxist critiques of capitalism in order to show how Foucault's conception of disciplinary power remains compatible with Marxism despite the differences between the two philosophical approaches (and despite Foucault's explicit critique of the "residual humanism" found within Marxist philosophical anthropology) (106).

A few of the essays in this initial section deepen our understanding of Foucault's work and therefore offer something more than textual interpretation. "The origin of Parr­ēsia in Foucault's Thinking: Truth and Freedom in the History of Madness by Leonard Lawlor and Daniel J. Palumbo" traces the origin of parrēsia or fearless speech back to 1961's History of Madness. Following a summary of the book's key themes, Lawlor and Palumbo show how the roots of this late concept can be found in one of Foucault's earliest works. Beginning in the seventeenth century, reason's goal is to make madness speak by rendering it an object of knowledge (27). Nevertheless, madness can escape this positivity, and it is in this flight that one finds an affinity with the later elaboration of parrēsia. Even in this first section in which the task of the essays is primarily exegetical, Lawlor and Palumbo demonstrate how innovative readings Foucault's work within these constraints.

Similarly, Samuel Talcott shows how Foucault's project in The Order of Things remains indebted to Georges Canguilhem's philosophy of science, and how this debt relates to Foucault's work on literature during the nineteen-sixties. Canguilhem sees philosophy as "the critical activity of making judgments about already instituted norms; it is the 'science of solved problems'" (65). Philosophy's restlessness lies in its various attempts to probe the limits of philosophy, "to think what is external to philosophy, not for the sake of judging the legitimacy of a solution, but rather to test current philosophical frameworks and hierarchies of values" (65). This is the basis of the paradoxical term that Foucault inherits from Canguilhem, the historical a priori. Like Canguilhem, Foucault conceives of philosophy as the descriptive work of thought's disruptions. These fail to proceed in a linear or dialectical manner, but rather irrupt from outside the various orders of thoughts and things that constitute our identities. Foucault sees literature as one of the sources of these disruptions.

David Scott reads Foucault's neglected work on Raymond Roussel, translated as Death and the Labyrinth, alongside another frequently overlooked text, The Birth of the Clinic. Scott points out that it is no coincidence that the two texts appeared during the same year, for they have many things in common despite appearing very different -- after all, tracing the origins of the modern clinic seems very different from interpreting the work of an obscure nineteenth century experimental French author beloved by Surrealists and other members of the early twentieth century avant-garde. Nevertheless, in both texts Foucault analyzes human finitude in ways that are irreducible to phenomenology. Foucault attempts in both these books to conceive death such that it is never mine.

In addition to this problem of attempting to simultaneously appeal to beginners and more advanced readers of Foucault, there is the problem of how we conceive Foucault's work in relationship to modernity and modernism, a problem which is never adequately addressed. Put simply, is Foucault's work relevant for understanding modernism? And do his interrogations of some of the most cherished values of the Enlightenment, and therefore modernity itself, have implications for Foucault and modernism? One's hopes for a more sustained engagement with this basic question in the introduction remain unfulfilled. Granted, a major problem here is that Foucault never explicitly addresses modernism, though we find references throughout his texts to figures who were either self-avowed modernists or who were deemed modernists after the fact. Given this problem, it seems incumbent on the editor and contributors to situate Foucault's work within this problematic of modernism. Frankly, some contributors do a better job of this than others, but an obvious place to begin to clarify the tangled web of relationships between Foucault, modernity, and modernism would be the introduction. Unfortunately, this does not happen.

In his 1991 Modernism as a Philosophical Problem, Robert Pippin provides a helpful account of the relationship between modern philosophy (German Idealism in particular) and artistic modernism that centers around the articulation and development of the concept of autonomy beginning with Kant and his early nineteenth century successors and continuing with the subsequent critique of this concept in the work of later philosophers such as Nietzsche and Heidegger.[1] Admittedly, Foucault's project differs in significant ways from Pippin's, which seeks to frame artistic modernism within the context of modern German philosophy, but one of the key virtues of Pippin's book is that it provides a clear account of the relationship between modern philosophy and modernism, something which many of the contributors to this volume assume but never clearly articulate.

A notable exception is Christopher Breu's excellent essay "Technologies of Modernism: Historicism in Foucault and Dos Passos," the first of five essays that comprise the second section. Breu begins by pointing out that Foucault does not conceive of modernism in formal terms but rather in terms of various technologies of modernism. Foucault eschews the form/content division that lies at the basis of formalist conceptions of modernism found in the work of Clement Greenberg, for example. Breu proposes a novel comparison between Foucault and the twentieth-century American novelist Dos Passos.

Part of the rethinking modernism through the writings of Foucault is thinking it less through the categories of form and content and more through the framework constituted of the technologies, discourses, and truths that govern, shape, challenge, and disrupt the parameters of a given historical conjuncture (137).

Foucault gives us modernist technologies rather than modernist formalisms. One of Foucault's basic questions concerns the constitution of the modern subject through various forms of power relations; Discipline and Punish provides a paradigmatic example of this sort of inquiry. But Foucault is also concerned with various technologies of the self that are devised to resist this subjectificaiton. Breu argues that Dos Passos's U.S.A. trilogy can be read as an inquiry similar to modernist literature:

Take for example the "Camera Eye" sections of the novel. On one level, these biographical sections (what really read more like prose poems) present Dos Passos at his most canonically modernist. . . . Yet, central to the sections is less a typically modernist emphasis on consciousness as opening out onto larger symbolic systems as such and more an emphasis on the technologies of subjectification (142).

The question posed by Dos Passos would thus be the Foucaultian question of how particular technologies of power and knowledge converge to constitute American subjects. Breu concludes that

The emphasis on materialities, technologies, and the open constitution of the subject is central to what makes both Dos Passos and Foucault modernist thinkers. It is also specific to the modernism that they represent, one that is less about the representation of consciousness divorced from its material embeddedness in various technologies and practices, and more about the various material coordinates of the human and the nonhuman (152).

Breu uses his fascinating juxtaposition of Foucault and Dos Passos to make the case for how we should consider Foucault a modernist thinker.

Ann Burlein returns to Foucault's Death and the Labyrinth in her fascinating contribution. She examines the relationship between the work of Foucault, Bataille, and Blanchot through the lens of spirituality. Burlein proposes that we should consider Foucault's treatment of "Roussel's oeuvre in the way that he reads that of Sade or Don Quixote in The Order of Things as 'threshold texts' that presage the relation between words and things, saying and seeing, of a subsequent era" (158). More precisely, Roussel's work represents the modernist attempt to express the materiality of language, shorn of the pretense to represent. Modernism seeks to open a space between words and things that would no longer seek the language of mastery. This is Bataille's terrain: Burlein reads Bataille's work as an attempt to undo the drive for mastery found in Hegel's Absolute. Similarly, Blanchot sees death as something that undoes the human will to mastery (Burlein here develops some of the same themes as Scott in his essay). Burlein argues

that Foucault reads Roussel's oeuvre as a series of limit experiences whose experiment with the non-instrumentality of language comprise meditations on the death that arises when an artist disappears behind his or her work in order that thought, in language, might encounter a double it cannot master (167).

Sarah Posman's essay turns from death to life in "Life Escaping: Foucault, Vitalism, and Gertrude Stein's Life-Writing." Drawing on Claire Colebrook's interpretation of Deleuze's vitalism, Posman distinguishes two kinds of vitalism. The first seeks to secure life as a vital force and "protect life from disintegrating." This sort of vitalism drives biotechnology research into human cloning and various prolife political movements (182). The second sort of vitalism is characterized not by the various efforts to secure life but rather to see life as differentiation, chance, and change. Deleuze ascribes this conception of life to Foucault, and Posman ascribes it to Stein.

This section's final two essays examine Foucault in relationship to painterly modernism. Joseph Tanke takes up Foucault's fascination with Manet that resulted in a series of lectures delivered in Tunis during 1971.[2] Just as Lawlor and Palumbo discover an anticipation of parrēsia in Foucault's History of Madness, Tanke argues that Foucault's Manet lectures anticipate his analysis of the figure of the cynic found in his final lecture course, The Courage of Truth. Foucault argues that the figure of the cynic recurs throughout European history, and counts modernist painters and writers as one of its most recent instantiations. But Manet is also important for Foucault's attempted archaeology of painting. Here Tanke distinguishes Foucault's famous reading of Velazquez' Las Meninas as an attempt to open a field of representation from Manet's project. Rather than opening a virtual space of representation on the canvas, "Manet's canvases open up a visual discourse upon representation itself, much like the Kantian critical project, and thereby escape the fate of simple representation" (202). This sounds very like Greenberg's formalist account of modernism that construes modernist art in Kantian terms, so one wonders how Tanke might square his account with Breu's claim that Foucault rejects formalisms in favor of technologies. Nevertheless, Tanke's essay reminds us of Foucault's work on Manet and suggests how it fits within the trajectory of Foucault's thought.

Nicole Ridgway also seeks to situate Foucault's work on a painter within the broader context of his work. "The Hermaphroditic Image: Modern Art, Thought, and Expérience in Michel Foucault" focuses on Foucault's 1975 catalogue essay on the French painter Gérard Fromanger. In this essay, Foucault uses the term "hermaphroditic images" to describe Fromanger's work. Fromanger works by projecting photographs onto canvas and then transforming the image through painting. Foucault characterizes this technique as monstrous, as it yields images with are neither photography nor painting but something in between (215). Ridgway connects this concept with Foucault's figure of the monster in his 1974-1975 lecture course Abnormal as well as in Herculine Barbine. Foucault's interest in Fromanger is a result of his fascination with these case histories of individuals deemed monstrous because they attempt to escape the categorical schemas that various authorities would seek to impose.

Despite my criticisms, this is a worthy volume of essays that deal ably with a number of Foucault's texts (e.g. Death and the Labyrinth, Birth of the Clinic) that have been relatively neglected by Foucault scholars, and they compare Foucault to figures with whom he is not typically associated (e.g. Dos Passo, Stein). The best of these essays open up new avenues for thinking with Foucault about modernism, and the essays in the first and third sections that do not explicitly address the theme of Foucault and modernism remain worthwhile as clear interpretations of some of Foucault's more difficult texts.

[1] Robert Pippin, Modernism as a Philosophical Problem. Blackwell, 1991.

[2] Michel Foucault, Manet and the Object of Painting. Trans. Matthew Barr. Tate Publishing, 2009.