Understanding Human Agency

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Erasmus Mayr, Understanding Human Agency, Oxford University Press, 2011, 314pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199606214.

Reviewed by Stewart Goetz, Ursinus College


In this excellent book, Erasmus Mayr argues that the problem of human agency is more basic than, and can be treated independently of, the problem of free will (14). Mayr claims that our self-understanding as human agents involves three commitments that, while they appear trivial, easily come into conflict. The three commitments are: (1) that a person is an agent who is active with regard to what he is doing (Mayr, it should be noted, is primarily concerned with human bodily actions, e.g., the agent moving his arm); (2) the agent is part of the natural order in the sense that his bodily actions are natural phenomena; and (3) human bodily actions, insofar as they are intentional, can be explained by the reasons for which they are performed. (1) is a conceptual truth: if an agent does not do something, then he does not act. (2) reflects the trivial truth that human beings are not divine or supernatural. And (3) describes the teleological kind of explanation that we invoke to understand why a human being acts in the way that he does (5-6).

How might these three commitments come into conflict? Consider how (1) and (2) are in tension. Since the seventeenth century, we have become accustomed to think of natural phenomena as those things that are explicable in terms of the natural sciences (physics, chemistry, biology, and neuroscience). A philosophical conception that has shaped our understanding of the natural sciences is the idea of event-causation, which depends on the notion of natural law and reduces human actions to nothing more than "happenings" in the general flux of events. If human actions are no more than such happenings, the agent turns out to be a patient (8-9).

Commitment (2) potentially conflicts with (3) because event-causal explanations of the natural sciences concern the same explanandum (the bodily behavior in bodily actions) as intentional (reasons) explanations. If we assume that explanatory overdetermination of bodily actions by independently complete mental purposeful (reasons) explanations and physical event-causal explanations is implausible, one of the two explanations will have to go. Given the success of event-causal explanations, one can make a case that mental explanations are dispensable. However, if one wants to try to keep mental explanations, one might assume that they are themselves event-causal explanations. But this is implausible, because reasons explanations rationalize the explanandum and do not mention either an event-cause at all or an event-cause that could have been the (a) cause of the action (10-11). Commitment (2) also conflicts with (3) because the natural sciences assume a bottom-up picture of reality in which mental explanations of bodily actions occur at a higher level and depend upon and are fixed by lower level event-causal explanations (neurophysiological). Given the concern about explanatory overdetermination, it seems that all of the real explanatory work is being done at the lower level (11-12).

How might commitments (1) and (3) conflict? One of the most well-known examples of the conflict arises out of Donald Davidson's distinction between an explanation and a rationalization of an action. Consider an agent who has two reasons to perform an action and by hypothesis performs it for only one of those reasons. What makes the one reason an explanation of the action and the other no more than a rationalization of it? According to Davidson, the one reason explains the action while the other does not because only the former event-causes the action's occurrence. But if the reason that is doing the explanatory work is an event-cause of the action, then the agent, as we have already seen, turns into no more than a passive sufferer of happenings (thus undermining commitment (1)). And if the agent's action can only be explained by a reason that causes it, then it is difficult to see how the agent's "activity" can have a reasons explanation (which would undermine commitment (3)), because there is no longer any activity that is a part of a process connecting reason and action (12).

As Mayr sees it, the task is to defuse the tensions between (1), (2), and (3), without a loss of any one of them. And an adequate response must go beyond refuting the particular arguments that claim to show specific incompatibilities between the three commitments to providing a positive unified account of them by making clear either how they can be reconciled or how their apparent tensions rest on a mistaken conception of one or more of the commitments (23-5). Providing a unified account requires "privileging" one of the commitments in the sense of taking it as the starting point, without subordinating the other two to it (5). Mayr believes that privileging commitment (3) is problematic because "intentionalism" generates a notion of action out of behavior that is intended, which makes it (nearly) impossible for us to account for the idea that agents can perform unintended actions (18-21; 36). Privileging commitment (2) is just as non-viable because it leads us to reduce agency to mere happenings (typically, the behavior that results from event-causal beliefs, desires, and/or intentions) in an event-causal order (43-5).

Given the problems with privileging either commitment (3) or (2), Mayr believes that the correct unified account will privilege commitment (1). To privilege (1), Mayr maintains that we must have a conception of agent causation that is consistent with commitment (2) yet conceptually and ontologically irreducible to event causation. To show that agent causation is consistent with commitment (2), Mayr argues that the natural world includes non-human substances with irreducible causal powers that make possible irreducible substance causation. A power is necessarily a power to X that is manifested (exercised): to behave in a certain way, to produce a certain effect, or to undergo a certain change. An example of a substance with a power is a magnet, which continuously exercises its power to attract iron objects such as a small metallic ball (206, 210). According to Mayr, the magnet's attracting the ball just is the magnet's exercising its causal power of attraction. There is nothing the magnet does to the ball that is not itself a causing of the ball's motion (210). Stated slightly differently, there is no exercising of magnetic force, which is a mode of operation, that is distinct from and does something to the ball's movement (e.g., initiates the movement or changes the ball's trajectory) (225). In sum, when an object like a magnet exercises its power to produce an effect, the magnet itself is the cause of this effect "because substance-causation consists in the manifestations of active (or 'causal') powers" (209).

Agent causation is just a specific instance of substance causation: "agent-causation is simply the specific form which substance-causation takes when the substance is a human agent" (247). Thus, agent causation is perfectly rooted in the natural world. Human agency is successfully explicable in terms of agent causation only if "the active powers of human persons are their abilities to perform physical actions -- to move parts of their bodies and produce further effects by doing so" (219). Thus, agent causation is involved in a human person exercising, say, his active bodily power to move his arm. When an agent performs the basic action of moving his arm, his arm moves, but there is no mode of operation that is distinguishable from the arm's motion that the person performs or does to produce the motion. Stated slightly differently, just as the magnet does not do something that is distinct from and produces the ball's movement, so also the agent's exercising of his power to move his arm is not something that he does, which is distinct from the arm's movement and produces in the latter (224-5).

Privileging commitment (1) and explaining human agency in terms of agent causation is also consistent with commitment (3). An agent's acting for a reason is his acting for a purpose (284). Thus, acting for a reason is rightly understood as following a standard of success, where the success is the behavioral/actional achievement of the purpose. The standard of success in the achievement of a purpose entails or imposes actual and hypothetical teleological structures on behavior: if there are obstacles to overcome, then the agent (given retention of the purpose) will adopt different means (actions) to achieve the end; and if there are no obstacles, then the agent (given retention of the purpose) would have adopted different means to achieve the end, if there had been obstacles (268-75). "Agency for reasons thus 'structures' -- for the limited time where the agent is being guided by a particular reason -- the manifestations of certain active powers, connecting them to certain situations" (295). Moreover, success at achieving a purpose is typically accompanied by feelings of satisfaction, and failure at achieving a purpose is typically accompanied by feelings of dissatisfaction (277). And it should come as no surprise that an agent engages in practical deliberation about means to an end: "the agent prospectively takes the purpose to provide the point of his action" (280) about whose achievement he deliberates. Because a purpose is an object of a value judgment (e.g., it is judged to be good), the agent concludes that he should act in one way or another to achieve the end (280). Thus, Mayr argues that acting for a reason as following a standard of success is an irreducibly normative notion (283).

Though acting for a reason is a purposeful notion, might it nevertheless presuppose an event-causal connection between desire and action? Mayr concedes that some actions are caused by eventful onslaughts of beliefs and desires. But this does not imply that all of our actions are event-caused by motivating reasons (252-3). Moreover, while it is true that several causal mechanisms, e.g., the agent's nervous system, must function properly for the agent to be able to follow a standard of success, these mechanisms are not (part of) the explanation of his behavior in terms of the standard that he was following. His bodily behavior is teleological in nature in light of the purpose for which he acts. With this bodily behavior, we are on a different level of explanation (287), because the active powers of human persons and their exercisings are emergent systemic properties -- they are exemplified only by the agent and not his parts, and are not reducible to microproperties (Chapter 9). In the end, there are no grounds to think that acting for a reason in terms of following a standard of success commits us even implicitly to an event-causal link between the motivating desire and action (290). Given that it does not, Mayr believes we have an answer to Davidson's challenge to account for how it is that an agent is able to act for only one of the reasons that he has for performing it (see above), if we reject the idea that reasons are event-causes of actions. Mayr maintains that the distinction between a reason that explains an action and one that only rationalizes it is accounted for by the fact that the agent "is following a standard of success provided by [the former reason] rather than by the other reason" (267; cf. 288, 290). In short, because exercisings of powers are not reducible to event-causation and an agent is able to exercise his power to raise his arm for one purpose that he has (e.g., to get the waiter's attention) and not for another that he also has (e.g., to ease tension in his shoulder), it is possible to answer Davidson's challenge without invoking an event-causal understanding of reasons explanations.

Such is the overall position that Mayr stakes out and defends with much careful argument (his defense includes an informative chapter on deviant causal chains (Chapter 5) as well as two chapters (Chapters 3 and 4) on what he believes are unsuccessful attempts by Harry Frankfurt and others (e.g., Gary Watson) to explain how we can have agency without agent causation). And while I am favorably disposed to the broad contours of Mayr's position, I will close with a couple of questions about his view.

First, though Mayr clearly and forcefully criticizes the event-causalist account of agency, I wonder whether he still accepts too much of the event-causalist conception of the world. For example, he seems implicitly to concede that if all causation were event causation, this would entail a commitment to the view that human actions are inescapably lawful in nature and reducible to mere happenings. But why think this is the case? For example, why could it not be the case that while all causation is event causation, not all causation is nomic in nature? Moreover, why could it not be the case that some event-causes are not caused at all, not even by agents? Early in the book (15-16), Mayr briefly discusses Timothy O'Connor's claim that agents agent-cause intentions whose content specifies the reason for which the action is performed. Mayr points out that "if the applicability of reasons-explanations to actions is ensured only by the content of a mental state that the agent causes, his causal activity itself seems to remain outside the purview of the reasons-explanation" (16). Presumably, then, Mayr believes that the agent-causal activity itself must have a reasons-explanation.

But if this is the case, why think we need agent causation at all? Why could it not be the case that, in Mayr's language, an agent directly exercises a power to move his arm, where this exercising of power is an event, but an event for which there is no cause? If agent-causal activity itself needs an explanation and a reasons-explanation of it is complete (leaves nothing to be accounted for), why could it not be the case that a reasons-explanation of an event that is an uncaused exercising of a power by an agential substance is complete? What explanatory work is agent causation doing at this point? Do we not have two explanations where the second (agent causation) is dependent on the first (the reason) and one alone (the reason) will suffice -- the agent causationist's own form of the problem of explanatory overdetermination (redundancy)? Mayr points out that the problem of explanatory overdetermination does not arise between neurophysiological and reasons-explanations because, like neurophysiological and agent-causal explanations, they occur at different explanatory levels. But because "reasons-explanations appear on the same explanatory level as . . . agent-causal explanations" (295), one wonders why the issue of explanatory overdetermination does not arise with them. Mayr claims that agent causation is "supplemented by a reasons-explanation" (244). But just how is the explanatory work parceled out here such that the latter is not complete without (in no need of supplementation by) the former? Mayr is silent about this matter.

Second, and very briefly, "What does it mean to say that an agent caused an effect (if it does not mean that an event involving the agent caused the effect (247)?" Mayr answers that "human agents have active powers to move parts of their bodies, and that agent-causation consists in the exercise of those powers" (247). But it remains puzzling nonetheless how an agent can cause the motion of his arm without an event that is distinct from that motion producing the latter. The concept of an exercise of a power certainly seems to be the concept of a kind of event. According to Mayr, when an agent performs the basic action of moving his arm, his arm moves, and this involves the agent causing effects at the neurophysiological level (244-7). But there is no event that is the exercising of power to move the arm that produces the neurophysiological effects and the motion of the arm. But why maintain that this exercising of power is not an event, when it certainly seems to be one? If agent causation is explanatorily superfluous in the way that I suggested in the previous paragraph, there is no harm in admitting that an exercise of power is what it seems to be.

In spite of these concerns, I enthusiastically recommend Understanding Human Agency. It is a first-rate piece of scholarship that deserves serious attention.