Understanding 'I': Language and Thought,

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José Bermúdez, Understanding ‘I’: Language and Thought, Oxford University Press, 2016, 160pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198796213.

Reviewed by Herman Cappelen, University of Oslo, and Josh Dever, University of Texas


The thesis that indexicals are in some sense ‘essential’ traces back to seminal papers by John Perry and David Lewis and is now a form of orthodoxy in philosophy (Perry 1977, 1979; Lewis 1979; for an overview of the literature see Cappelen and Dever 2013, chapter one). The thesis has its origin in the philosophy of language and mind, but the implications are assumed to stretch into all areas of philosophy: epistemology, theories of perception and of action, moral philosophy, and metaphysics. More generally, the alleged insight of essential indexicality has been taken to show that perspective — and the perspective of the first person in particular — plays an important role throughout philosophy. An enormous amount of work, in all areas of philosophy, relies on these alleged insights from Perry and Lewis.

Despite this, there’s remarkably little consensus about what constitutes arguments or evidence for the thesis of essential indexicality. Those who advocate or rely on the thesis will often refer to the papers mentioned above. But while those papers contain intriguing and suggestive examples (paradigmatically Perry’s messy shopper, Lingens the amnesiac, and Lewis’s two gods), they contain few clear arguments. The examples that everyone remembers show nothing on their own, and it’s a challenge, to put it mildly, to figure out how to use those examples in the service of sound arguments with essential indexicality as a conclusion. José Bermúdez’s book is a welcome effort to meet this challenge. His ambitious aim is to provide what he takes to be the real argument for essential indexicality, to correctly articulate the thesis, and then to show that it is philosophically significant.

The first chapter aims to establish the foundations for what follows. Bermúdez presents what he sees as the fundamental argument for essential indexicality and the connection between indexicality and agency: explanations of actions must contain indexical elements to be complete. The second chapter develops a general framework for thinking about the connection between sense and understanding: the sense of an expression is what competent language users understand. The third and fourth chapters apply this general framework to develop a theory of what understanding ‘I’ amounts to. Bermúdez’s view is inspired by that of Gareth Evans, but he argues that Evans failed to explain how ‘I’ thoughts can be objective — e.g., how they can be understood by others, and how others can deny and report on what someone said using ‘I’. In chapters five and six, Bermúdez develops a theory that improves on Evans’ in these respects; it provides an account of the ‘token sense’ of ‘I’ that satisfies the various desiderata presented in earlier chapters and avoids the alleged pitfalls of Evans’ theory. The final chapter applies the theory to give an account of immunity to error through misidentification.

In what follows, we first present and assess the argument for essential indexicality in Chapter 1. We then focus on Bermudez’s Evans-inspired account of the sense of ‘I’. We end with an assessment of his proposal for how to explain the alleged phenomenon of immunity to error through misidentification.

The Perry-Lewis tradition has not been without critics. An early and powerful criticism of Perry can be found in Ruth Millikan’s 1990 paper ‘The Myth Of The Essential Indexical’. Contemporary critics of the tradition include the authors of this review (Cappelen and Dever 2013) and Ofra Magidor (2015). Bermúdez’s first chapter is called “‘I’: An Essential Indexical” and is a response to this critical tradition. More specifically, it’s a reply to the arguments in the third chapter of Cappelen and Dever (2013). Bermudez’s aim is to articulate the real, underlying argument for essential indexicality — an argument that, according to Bermúdez, has not been articulated before and is immune to our objections.

According to Bermúdez, the argument for essential indexicality should be construed as having three steps (2017: 15):

Premise 1: No action rationalization can correctly reconstruct an agent’s practical reasoning if it is possible for some agent to hold every propositional attitude in the set and not perform the action.

Premise 2: Even if an agent holds every propositional attitude in an impersonal action rationalization, she will not perform the consequent action if she believes that she is not the person referred to in the action rationalization.

Premise 3: For any impersonal action rationalization, it is possible for an agent to hold every propositional attitude in the set and nonetheless believe that she herself is not the person referred to in those attitudes.

From these three premises, Bermúdez derives:

IICa: Impersonal action rationalizations are necessarily incomplete.

The notion of an ‘impersonal action rationalization’ is introduced in Chapter 3 of Cappelen and Dever (2013). We argue that Impersonal Action Rationalizations come in two kinds, and we illustrate them as follows (2013: 36):

Impersonal Action Rationalization 1.

• Belief: François is about to be shot.

• Desire: François not be shot.

• Belief: If François ducks under the table, he will not be shot.

• Action: François ducks under the table.

Impersonal Action Rationalization 2.

• Belief: Nora is in danger.

• Desire: Nora not be hurt.

• Belief: If the door is closed, Nora will be safe.

• Action: Herman closes the door.

We argue that both of these can be complete, i.e., that we don’t need to add any first-personal beliefs (i.e. we don’t need to add a belief that the agent would express using ‘I’) in order to fully reconstruct the agent’s practical reasoning. Bermúdez’s argument aims to respond to that claim. The argument is directed at Impersonal Action Rationalization 1 above: according to Bermúdez’s Premise 3, Francois can believe that he is not Francois (as happens in the paradigm Lewis-Perry cases, where subjects are confused about their identity), and so, by Premise 1 and 2, Impersonal Action Rationalization 1 cannot correctly reconstruct his practical reasoning. He concludes that any complete action rationalization must include an indexical component. This is the foundation for the thesis of essential indexicality.

We have two concerns about Bermúdez’s argument for the conclusion that indexicals play an essential role in explaining and rationalizing agency. First, recall Impersonal Action Rationalization 2 above. Note that the propositional attitudes referred to in that rationalization don’t mention or refer to the agent, i.e. don’t refer to Herman. It doesn’t attribute “Herman”-beliefs or “Herman”-desires to Herman. Instead, the rationalization is entirely third-person. Here is what we think happens: when Herman sees his daughter in danger, he just acts. Not via some representation of himself: he doesn’t, for example, need to go via the belief that Nora is Herman’s daughter. He just acts when Nora is in danger. With that in mind, consider Bermúdez’s Premise 2. In saying “she will not perform the consequent action if she believes that she is not the person referred to in the action rationalization,” this premise simply presupposes that all action rationalisations are of the subject-referring kind and that none are of our second kind. Bermúdez gives no argument for that assumption. Maybe we shouldn’t have included such cases, but the focus of Bermúdez chapter isn’t to establish that; he simply assumes it.

This first part of our reply shows that Bermúdez’s argument has no force against non-subject-referring action rationalizations. However, his argument also fails when its scope is restricted to subject-referring action rationalizations. Bermúdez’s Premise 1 places a very strong necessity requirement on such action rationalizations. For a set S of propositional attitudes to reconstruct an agent’s practical reasoning, it must be impossible for any agent to hold all of those attitudes and not perform the action. But as stated, this principle is clearly false. Suppose Alex wants a drink of water and believes there is water in the glass, and she then picks up the glass. Prima facie, we’d like to say that her desire and belief explain her action. But it’s possible for Alex to be tied to the chair, or to be paralyzed, or to be given drugs that interfere with her practical reasoning. In any of these cases, she would not pick up the glass. These possibilities, however, do not prevent her desire and belief from rationalizing her actual (unimpaired) action.

Action rationalizations, like most explanations, are typically ceteris paribus. They take place against a background of normal conditions, and they don’t bring about the explanandum when conditions are sufficiently abnormal. Bermúdez’s Premise 1 disallows ceteris paribus explanations, because it requires that there be no possibility of having the explanans without getting the explanandum as well, no matter how abnormal the situation. Premise 1 should thus be rejected. Without Premise 1, Bermúdez’s argument collapses, even if (contrary to our remarks above) Premise 2 is accepted.

Suppose we rewrite Premise 1 to allow ceteris paribus explanations:

Premise 1*: No action rationalization can correctly reconstruct an agent’s practical reasoning if there are normal conditions in which some agent holds every propositional attitude in the set but does not perform the action.

For Bermúdez’s reasoning to go through, Premise 3 would need to be revised to guarantee that the addition of identity-confusion beliefs fell under normal conditions:

Premise 3*: For any impersonal action rationalization, there are normal conditions in which an agent holds every propositional attitude in the set and nonetheless believes that she herself is not the person referred to in those attitudes.

But we see no reason to accept Premise 3*. Our grip on ‘normal conditions’ is through our understanding of the sorts of agents we are trying to explain, so to convince us that adding identity-confusion beliefs always preserves normality, you have to convince us that our explanatory practice isn’t sometimes designed for non-identity-confused agents.

To see what’s going on more clearly, remember that identity-confusion beliefs are not the only beliefs that will be covered by ceteris paribus clauses. Alex desires water, and she believes that there is water in the glass. But if she believes that everyone on earth will be tortured if she picks up the glass, she will not pick up the glass. We would be inclined to think that a belief that global torture results from lifting a glass is an abnormal belief, and thus gets swept up into the ceteris paribus clause. Consider an analogue of Bermúdez’s argument. Call an action rationalization atortural if it says nothing about whether torture results from lifting glasses. Then:

Premise 1*: No action rationalization can correctly reconstruct an agent’s practical reasoning if there are normal conditions in which some agent holds every propositional attitude in the set but does not perform the action.

Modified Premise 2: Even if an agent holds every propositional attitude in an atortural action rationalization, she will not perform the action if she believes that global torture will result from performing it.

Modified Premise 3*: For any atortural action realization, there are normal conditions in which an agent holds every propositional attitude in the set and nonetheless believes that global torture will result from performing the action.

We then conclude that atortural explanations are always incomplete. Perhaps we’ve just discovered a new kind of essentiality. In addition to indexical essentiality, there’s also torturous essentiality. No explanation of action without beliefs about torture. We would rather use modus tollens on that conditional, and conclude that neither kind of attitude is essential, because in both cases the relevant conditions are abnormal. But for those not convinced, we note that the new essentiality argument is very powerful. Take any belief B of Alex’s. If Alex believed that if B and she lifts the glass, then everyone on earth will be tortured, then she will not perform the action. So for any B-free action rationalization, we can find a B-containing expansion of it that blocks realization of the action. If that expansion is normal, then the B-free rationalization will be incomplete.

Suppose, despite the preceding, someone does accept that there is an important kind of essential indexicality, and thus concludes that there must be some special kind of content expressed by ‘I’ (and other indexical) thoughts. There is then a real danger of going in for mystery mongering — for claiming that there’s just a certain something about ‘I’ thoughts, but that nothing can be said about what that something amounts to. One of the great virtues of Bermúdez’s book is that he is definitely not a mystery monger. The aspiration of the book is to give a clear statement of what the special self concept expressed by the word ‘I’ is.

Bermúdez begins by (in chapter 2) situating his project in the context of a broadly Fregean picture of senses as that which users of a language must grasp for understanding and then (in chapter 3) taking as a starting point for the sense of ‘I’ the kind of picture Evans gives in Varieties of Reference. However, a distinctive feature of Bermúdez’s account of the self concept is his commitment (elaborated and defended in chapter 4) to what he calls the Symmetry Constraint, which requires that ‘I’ thoughts of one agent also be thinkable (perhaps as ‘you’ thoughts) by another agent. Combining the Symmetry Constraint with an essential role for ‘I’ thoughts in action then leads Bermúdez (in chapter 5) to distinguish between the type sense of ‘I’ — what language users must grasp in order to understand a sentence type involving the word ‘I’ without knowing the context in which that sentence was produced — and the token senses (different tokens of ‘I’ will typically have different senses) of ‘I’ — what language users must grasp in order to understand a particular utterance involving ‘I’. It is the token sense that plays the essential role in action, on Bermúdez’s view, so the crucial task is to give an account of the token sense that satisfies the Symmetry Constraint while still explaining action.

The account of the token sense of ‘I’ (in chapter 6) is thus the centerpiece of Bermúdez’s positive account. From the broadly Evansian starting point, Bermúdez sets aside connections to private evidential routes as unsuitable for meeting the Symmetry Constraint, and singles out the specific notion of self-location as the key to the self concept(s). The selfA concept on Bermúdez’s account is the ability to transition from locating A in egocentric space to locating A in non-egocentric (allocentric space). That ability can be possessed both by A and by other agents, via their ability to transition from locating A in their egocentric space to locating A in allocentric space.

“Locating an object in allocentric space,” though, is not a digital on/off matter. To say that Bermúdez is in Texas is to locate him in allocentric space, but to say that he is in College Station is to locate him more thoroughly in allocentric space. In the limit, a full ability to locate an object in allocentric space presumably amounts to an ability to specify all “objective” features of that object, since any feature can be reconstrued (in familiar Lewisian manner) as a locational feature. But this means that the self concept (or grasp of the self concept) is an analog matter. A person can have a richer or a poorer self concept, and the degree of the self concept should fluctuate greatly with time and circumstances. This is a curious result ㅡ it entails that when you visit a strange city, and are less able to locate yourself on a map than usual, your ability to think first-personally about yourself weakens.

Bermúdez endorses this result, but it’s hard to see how to fit it together with the thought that first-personal thought plays some essential role in action. Your ability to act doesn’t diminish when you are in the strange city, so how can there be a special link between acting and a manner of thinking that does diminish? It’s tempting then to think that the underlying problem is that the ability to act doesn’t in fact depend on an ability to locate oneself in allocentric space. If you want to open the refrigerator, why would you need to know where on a map you are? Perhaps you need to know where you are relative to the refrigerator, and perhaps this in some weak sense is a matter of knowing where you are in allocentric space (in a spatial system “centered on the refrigerator,” rather than centered on you). But even this isn’t obvious. If you have causal powers over the refrigerator that don’t run through your body, it’s not clear why you would need to know where you are relative to the refrigerator to open the refrigerator. Even if your causal powers do run through your body, it looks like what you really need is to know where (for example) your hand is relative to the refrigerator, not where you are. It’s then just a (robust) contingency that your hand is reliably located near where you are.

What’s really going on here, we suggest, is this: if there’s an action you want to perform that involves getting objects A and B into contact with one another, then generally it’s helpful to know how A and B are spatially located relative to one another. (Generally, not always. You might, again, have causal powers that let you get A and B into contact with one another without knowing where either is.) One of the objects you often want to get into contact with other objects in acting is yourself (or your body). So it’s often helpful, in acting, to know where you are relative to things around you. But there’s nothing conceptually special about you in this picture. In particular, there’s nothing that requires a special notion of “egocentric space”. The locative requirements on you are no different from the locative requirements on other objects that are targets of action. But if what (for example) Bermúdez needs for (many) actions is the ability to locate Bermúdez, then we don’t have an account of what makes Bermúdez’s ‘I’ concept a distinctively first-personal concept, as opposed to a Bermúdez concept possessed by its target. So we aren’t convinced that Bermúdez has succeeded in giving an account of a concept that satisfies the Symmetry Constraint, plays a distinctive role in the possibility of action, and is interestingly indexical in any sense.

The final chapter turns to the topic of immunity to error through misidentification (IEM). Because the Symmetry Constraint has led Bermúdez to drop (for example) distinctive connections to evidential routes such as proprioception from his account of the self concept, he can’t derive IEM from the self concept in the way that others have done. Instead, Bermúdez wants to locate the source of IEM in the ascribed predicate, not in the self concept to which the predication is made. Thus ‘to have the concept of toothache is to be disposed immediately to judge that one has toothache when one feels pain of the right kind in one’s teeth’ (2017: 131). The desired result is that when one judges that one has toothache on the basis of one’s own pain, one cannot be wrong about who has the toothache, because it’s part of the concept of toothache that pains lead to toothache judgments only about oneself.

This is a novel approach to IEM, but it’s not clear how it can succeed. Merely being disposed to judge in a certain way can’t, of course, in itself remove the epistemic possibility of being mistaken in judging in that way, and thus can’t produce genuine immunity to error. What’s really needed is that the concept of toothache be such that your pain can’t be evidence for anyone else’s toothache. But how can a concept guarantee that? It’s possible to set up the evidential structure of the world such that your pain can be evidence of someone else’s toothache (rewiring cases, in which your pain centers are connected to someone else’s teeth, will easily do that job). We can stipulatively introduce the notion of a toothache*, which is the sort of thing for which your pain can’t be evidence of in other people ㅡ but then we’ll just discover that (as a matter of epistemic necessity) there are no toothaches*. We’ll be immune to error through misidentification with respect to toothache* judgments, but only cheaply, by virtue of their definite non-existence.

Bermúdez’s book didn’t convince us that indexicals are essential or that the first-person perspective is philosophically significant. That said, the book is an ambitious, original, and instructive effort to defend the philosophical significance of the first-person perspective. The entire literature on this topic rests on a weak, shaky, or non-existing foundation. The way to make progress is to do what Bermúdez attempts: develop new foundations. If those keep crumbling (as we predict they will), the orthodoxy should be rejected, and that should have repercussions throughout philosophy.


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Lewis, David (1979). Attitudes de dicto and de se. Philosophical Review 88 (4):513-543.

Magidor, Ofra (2015). The Myth of the De Se. Philosophical Perspectives 29 (1):249-283.

Millikan, Ruth Garrett (1990). The myth of the essential indexical. Noûs 24 (5):723-734.

Perry, John (1977). Frege on demonstratives. Philosophical Review 86 (4):474-497.

Perry, John (1979). The problem of the essential indexical. Noûs 13 (December):3-21.