Understanding Ignorance: The Surprising Impact of What We Don't Know

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Daniel R. DeNicola, Understanding Ignorance: The Surprising Impact of What We Don't Know, MIT Press, 2017, 264 pp., $27.95, ISBN 9780262036443.

Reviewed by Steven James, West Chester University of Pennsylvania


Daniel DeNicola aspires to give a comprehensive study of ignorance that makes a proper contribution to philosophy and epistemology while also appealing to a broader audience. The discussion is wide ranging and will be particularly useful for those unfamiliar with the topic. However, the pace is generally very quick and the self-described "broad brush" approach often prevents the project from contributing much of significant philosophical depth to the literature. Nevertheless, it is an enjoyable read and points the reader to a variety of interesting historical and emerging areas of research in multiple domains.

The book is designed around four spatial metaphors that correspond to the four central parts of the text: (i) place, (ii) boundary, (iii) limit, and (iv) horizon. I will briefly summarize and note strengths and weaknesses of some of the main claims before engaging more carefully with two of the text's more philosophically substantive elements.

In 'Ignorance as Place', DeNicola contrasts Plato's Allegory of the Cave with the biblical Garden of Eden to illuminate competing historical perspectives on the fact that, to varying degrees, we all "dwell in ignorance". Over the course of two chapters, he discusses a wide array of research and offers numerous examples to support the plausible claim that ignorance is too multifaceted to view in either an exclusively negative or an exclusively positive light. Along with some effective introductory discussion about the impact of ignorance on society and individuals, this sets the tone for the project: ignorance is much more than just the absence of knowledge and understanding it will help us to understand the human condition.

The bulk of the work comes in 'Ignorance as Boundary', where four chapters are dedicated to topics ranging from the structure and causes of ignorance, to its relation to epistemic virtues/vices and the ethics of belief. Highlights from this section include a very effective cartography metaphor that illuminates interactions between knowledge and ignorance: they shape one another, the boundary between them is often vague, and shifts, and it can be created naturally or artificially. The author also provides a nice inventory of empirical and philosophical research on different forms of intentional ignorance (e.g. strategic ignorance, willful ignorance, forbidden knowledge, etc.) and epistemic injustice. Less effective are a somewhat peculiar characterization and critique of "mainstream" epistemology and a promising discussion of the virtues and vices of ignorance that delivers a bit less than expected. I will come back to both below.

In 'Ignorance as Limit', DeNicola aims to identify the types of limits to knowledge and their sources; they range from contingent biological facts about humans to conceptual facts pertaining to the very possibility of a coherent notion of omniscience. He next catalogues some of the most important mechanisms we have for dealing with ignorance. Key topics include superstition and ritual, and behavioral economics and institutional design. The claims made in this part of the book are generally compelling, and a great deal of interesting work is cited, but the discussion remains relatively superficial. For example, just one paragraph is dedicated to describing empirical research on decision-making under conditions of uncertainty, the charge that this kind of descriptive work must be set against a normative account of decision making in order to manage ignorance, and lamentation of the fact that rational choice theory is limited in application due to its "simplistic and controversial" assumptions (161). These are interesting topics and claims. And while it would be unfair to expect an in-depth discussion of all of them in this kind of project, it also isn't clear what one should take away from what is offered. One unfamiliar with the empirical research and rational choice theory is likely to be left in the dark about the nature and import of these claims; one familiar with these topics may find the claims to be plausible but feel that little has been added to this well-trod territory.

This is an example of one of the more frustrating aspects of the text. DeNicola points to very interesting issues, and briefly summarizes bits and pieces of work being done in these areas. However, he generally adds little to the discussion beyond the (sometimes too) brief glosses on others' research and the result is likely to be a bit underwhelming for both the novice and the expert.

That said, in 'Ignorance as Horizon', DeNicola does explicitly set out the project's key contributions to the literature, which are meta-epistemological in nature. In particular, the discussion is meant to generate the aforementioned critique of "mainstream" epistemology, and to motivate expansion of it in various ways. Some of his claims are plausible. For example, the study of ignorance will both benefit from and contribute to developments in various sub-disciplines of epistemology (e.g. social, feminist, knowledge-first, etc.), and DeNicola is surely to be commended for drawing explicit attention to ignorance itself. However, the critique of 'standard Anglophone epistemology' (196) relies on a rather narrow conceptualization of it, as many of the central developments in epistemology since the 1970s (e.g. reliabilism, virtue epistemology, work on testimony, contextualism, and the aforementioned sub-disciplines) fall outside the scope of the "mainstream". Consequently, it isn't always clear what DeNicola's actual targets are, and, despite a revisionary tone, the proposed expansion amounts to a modest call for emphasis on more inclusive investigations of epistemic phenomena.

One of the more specific "traditional" targets is the 'disjunctive view' of knowledge (42-3, 71-5 and 202-3), according to which it is a binary state: one either knows or fails to know. In its place, DeNicola advocates a 'spectral view' on which knowing is a continuum or spectrum of epistemic states. The motivation offered for this revision is a bit underdeveloped and tends to slip between or gloss over a variety of important distinctions. DeNicola claims, for example, that the disjunctive view is in tension with the fact that the boundary between knowledge and ignorance is vague. However, when talking about this boundary, he is interested in the knowledge/ignorance divide in whole bodies of knowledge, not particular tokens of knowledge. From the discussion, it isn't clear how the disjunctive view relates to vagueness of this sort or why it should struggle to capture it; arguably, such vagueness may largely be a function of the extent to which different subjects know some things and fail to know others. He also claims that the disjunctive view is not equipped to accommodate the role of 'levels of consciousness', or cases of 'borderline knowledge' (72), but the phenomena he cites are generally amenable to treatments in terms of familiar distinctions between, e.g. propositional vs. non-propositional knowledge, dispositional vs. occurrent knowledge, implicit vs. explicit knowledge, and so forth. DeNicola may be right that the disjunctive view must go, but he doesn't quite make a compelling case for that conclusion here.

Perhaps the most intriguing part of the project is the discussion of ignorance in a virtue-theoretic framework (chapter 8). That ignorance might be thought vicious, and the desire to remove it virtuous, is probably no surprise to the modern reader. More striking is DeNicola's claim that ignorance can be virtuous as well. However, once the claim is fleshed out, it is a bit less provocative than it initially seemed. In the course of briefly summarizing work on familiar epistemic virtues, e.g. curiosity and intellectual humility, DeNicola makes a convincing case for the claim that judicious ignorance can have value for an epistemic community (117). However, he seems to take it for granted that the value is an epistemic one and suggests that ignorance is epistemically virtuous. This would be a striking result, but it is not clear that this is the best interpretation of the cited phenomena.

The most explicit case for this conclusion is borrowed from Neil C. Manson. He asks us to consider a man who is curious about the value of a porcelain figurine he owns and who proceeds to ask detailed questions of an expert while the expert is grieving at the funeral for his young daughter. According to DeNicola, the subject's lack of sensitivity and judgment 'taints his curiosity' (121) and this is one of those cases in which it is simply 'better not to know' something.

There is little question that this is a case in which a subject has behaved viciously. However, it is unclear why we are to think that the vice is an epistemic one, as opposed to primarily, if not exclusively, a moral one. If the subject were to stumble upon access to his desired information at the funeral, should he refrain from satisfying his curiosity? Suppose, for example, that the grieving expert were to offer the subject his desired information unprompted before the insensitive questioning could begin. While it would be odd, and perhaps vicious on the part of the grieving expert, it is difficult to see what would be vicious about the curiosity itself, and it is hard to see how continued ignorance on the matter would be virtuous. In short, the subject's lack of sensitivity and judgment display social vices, but of which kind is not settled. This is worth considering because it is plausible that vices in one domain, e.g. the ethics of social norms, can compete with virtues in others, e.g. the epistemic domain. Recognizing this opens the door to many further questions about how to structure theorizing, frame research questions, and so forth. Perhaps the point is that holistic social theorizing cannot treat epistemic and ethical values as entirely independent matters. That is quite plausible; but blurring the useful distinction between epistemic and other kinds of value, as DeNicola has here, may create more confusion than understanding. At the very least, the brevity with which such interesting matters are treated leaves a great deal of work to be done by the reader.

Such critiques aside, there is undoubtedly much to appreciate in this project. Despite having a bit of a frantic pace, the text is accessible and addresses many very interesting and important topics in an interesting and often compelling way. In short, within its pages, the curious reader will find an abundance of ideas and research programs to explore, and even if they may not necessarily come to have a substantially greater understanding of ignorance, they will surely find themselves with a greater appreciation of its importance.


Manson, Neil C. (2012) 'Epistemic Restraint and the Vice of Curiosity' Philosophy 87, No. 2. 239-59