Understanding Inconsistent Science

Placeholder book cover

Peter Vickers, Understanding Inconsistent Science, Oxford University Press, 2013, 273pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199692026.

Reviewed by Sorin Bangu, University of Bergen


Peter Vickers' monograph stands out as a very serious piece of scholarship in historically- and scientifically-informed philosophy of science. It is to be strongly recommended to both philosophers (of science) and reflectively inclined scientists, especially physicists and mathematicians. (Although the title mentions 'science' as a whole, there is virtually nothing in it about biology or the social sciences.) The work has five virtues and one shortcoming. I will begin by presenting the virtues, and shall close with a couple of comments on the aspect of the book I find slightly disappointing.

One impressive feature of the monograph is its comprehensiveness. The contents leave no stone unturned. The author examines the four major scientific episodes traditionally offered as examples of inconsistent science, discusses the logic of inconsistency (arguing against the relevance of developing paraconsistent systems), and delves into philosophically oriented history of science. In addition, one can find an extended meta-philosophical reflection on, and justification of, the very method chosen to investigate inconsistency ('theory eliminativism'; see below). Chapter 1 charts the territory of inconsistency in the philosophical literature, and chapter 2 explicates and defends the method to be employed in understanding scientific inconsistency. The next four chapters (3 to 6) are the heart of the book, and consist of four concrete case studies on which the method is applied. The cases are: Bohr's theory of the atom, classical electrodynamics, Newtonian cosmology, and the early calculus. Chapter 7 takes up in less detail four more examples: Aristotle's theory of motion, Olbers' paradox, the 'classical' theory of the electron and Kirchhoff's theory of diffraction. Parts of the book draw on materials published previously in mainstream philosophy of science journals and researched during the author's doctoral thesis, but it should be stressed that Vickers succeeds in integrating them in a very natural fashion.

The result of this extended exploration is that inconsistency in science, when it truly deserves its name, is not one thing, but many; 'all inconsistencies are unequal' (p. 38) means that no general, compact theory of inconsistency in science is offered, because none is possible. Vickers confesses that he has 'no agenda', pro or con, for finding inconsistencies (p. 156), and that he is bound to follow, unbiased, the lead of his case studies, wherever they take him. Thus, we visit a varied landscape, a series of similar, but also different, inconsistent looking contexts and situations. All in all, it is diversity and not unity that characterizes the subject. I said 'when inconsistency deserves its name', because one of the main points Vickers drives home (perhaps the point) is that the reports about the existence of inconsistency in science have been greatly exaggerated. Yes, there are some cases when we are entitled to speak about inconsistency in the way we normally do (as accepting a finite set of sentences that entail a contradiction). But such cases are rare and, if I counted correctly, there are only two in the book. One is Wolfgang Pauli's derivation of such a contradiction from Bohr's postulates and Paul Ehrenfest's adiabatic principle (this is the clearest case, documented here for the first time in the literature). The second is another clear, but somewhat less definitive case, based on a particular reading of the main theses of Newtonian cosmology. However, the alarming (yet common) claim that inconsistencies plague science systematically simply can't be substantiated, as the other cases can be analyzed in such a way as to reveal that the inconsistencies are harmless, or merely apparent.

The general tenor of the book is thus 'deflationary' (as one may say), and this, on further reflection, is somehow paradoxical in itself: in a sense, the book leaves its reader suspecting that its subject matter doesn't quite exist, and thus becomes yet another ladder that can be thrown away once the illumination point has been reached -- at the end of 253 pages of well-disciplined prose. But, as I said above, I by no means suggest this -- quite the opposite; every philosopher of science should rush to have the monograph on her shelf, since, if Vickers is right, this might well be the last book on this topic!

The second positive aspect of the monograph is its preoccupation with the philosophical method employed to extract the main claims. This method is what Vickers calls 'theory eliminativism'. Here is, very briefly, what this means and why it is appropriate to adopt it. Not surprisingly, the term refers to the strategy of studying inconsistency in science without bothering whether the set of propositions suspected to lead to a contradiction really belong to (or constitute) the scientific theory usually presented as inconsistent. All that matters, urges Vickers, is not how we manage to delineate the theory of interest -- after struggling to answer the allegedly deeper question 'what is a scientific theory?' -- but rather (a) whether a set of inconsistent looking propositions can be precisely identified, such that their grouping together is scientifically and historically relevant, and (b) whether historically significant actors (major scientists) can be listed as actually committed to these propositions. I fully agree with the author that a lot of ink has been misspent in the last several decades on the above mentioned question, and that adopting this kind of eliminativism is indeed crucial for making progress on understanding inconsistency in science. Note, however, that Vickers is fully aware of the danger of arbitrary groupings of such sets of claims and therefore devotes significant effort to explicating how his method escapes this danger in general (see sections 2.3 to 2.8 in chapter 2), as well as in each case under discussion.

Another virtue that should be mentioned is the author's attention to historical and technical-scientific detail. He demonstrates that details matter a lot when trying to understand why, and how, inconsistencies (do not) arise -- in fact, one might even say that for Vickers the inconsistency is(n't) in the details. Looking at the four main chapters from this perspective, they come out as exemplarily well researched, combining factual-historical data and quite sophisticated mathematical physics. This unfortunately (and perhaps unavoidably) renders parts of the book somewhat inaccessible to those who don't have a fairly extensive scientific background. However, I can also see the book serving as an excellent source of readings for a graduate research seminar, in which more advanced students can be assigned individual chapters for presentation and discussion.

Having covered this pedagogical virtue, another of the book's positive feature is its serious engagement with the recent work of several contemporary influential philosophers of science. It's mostly contemporaries on Vickers' radar, but his targets include virtually everyone who has touched on the topic in the past 400 years. At times he sounds almost polemical, yet he is very careful and, it seems to me, fair in formulating his objections. Thus, there is plenty of material to ponder about authors such as Thomas Nickels, Bryson Brown and Graham Priest, John Norton, F. A. Muller, Gordon Belot and Mathias Frisch -- as well as clever reevaluations of the positions on inconsistency traditionally attributed to Galileo, Bishop Berkeley or Imre Lakatos.

One dissatisfaction the reader may feel is that the analyses end too soon; for every case, once the historical-scientific evaluation of the key question has been completed (inconsistency or not?), we move on to the next case. I would like to have seen more of the author's talents in action while foraying deeper into the very intriguing suggestions he makes, usually toward the end of the chapters. I suspect there were editorial constraints imposed on the length of the manuscript, but, if so, they should have been negotiated. Here is an example of such a suggestion, based on my favorite, truly excellent chapter 6 ('The Early Calculus').

Vickers begins with the standard story of the first days of the Calculus. The gist of the issue can be grasped without resorting to the mathematical details (for these, see pp. 147-149). In finding the tangent to a curve at a given point, both Newton and Leibniz had to first assume that a certain quantity ('increment') is strictly positive, and then, in the last step of the computation, they had to take that quantity to be zero (in the jargon, this is an 'infinitesimal'). If this is not an inconsistency, then nothing is -- one might think. However, Vickers' analysis shows that things are more complicated. He draws on a distinction in the literature, between 'the level of justification' (p. 156) of the calculus, and the 'algorithmic level' of it (p. 150), and points out that considered as an algorithm, the air of inconsistency disappears. An algorithm -- a succession of directions to follow: 'if you want to calculate the tangent, do this, and then do that, etc.' -- can't be inconsistent provided that (i) it doesn't deliver wrong results (which the early calculus never did), and (ii) it doesn't deliver different outputs for the same inputs (which, again, the early calculus didn't) (pp. 150-156). One is of course entitled to ask how is it that the algorithm works so well, and thus we reach the level of justification. It is here where Bishop Berkeley claimed to have found the inconsistency famously announced in his 1734 work The Analyst.

Vickers patiently considers both Newton's and Leibniz's positions on the justification of the calculations in terms of infinitesimals (see subsections 6.4.1 and 6.4.2 in chapter 6), and argues convincingly that neither is commited to the relevant set of inconsistent propositions. (Unlike other cases, here the inconsistency is very close to the surface, and even lesser minds would have detected it right way). In summary, it turns out that Newton wasn't bothered by the 'inconsistency' because he had known (yet did not publish, for many years!) a different kind of justification, virtually identical to the modern one in terms of limits. Leibniz, on the other hand, was insistent in denying (especially in private letters) his commitment to the existence of the infinitesimals, and thus, Vickers suggests, he treated them as useful fictions. (If there was anybody among the giants of early mathematical physics who can be rightly suspected to have been guilty of holding an inconsistent set of (mathematical) beliefs, then this was Johann Bernoulli. Yet, as Vickers documents, he, like many others during that period, paid almost no attention to the justificatory level of the calculus, his main interest lying in using this marvelous new algorithm to solve problems in mathematical physics.)

Vickers' analysis of the case is quite complex and multilayered, and I'm leaving out many elements of it, but I should say that I very much enjoyed the detective work done by the author in this chapter. The story is coherent, the arguments nicely crafted and the historical data well-researched. Vickers has illuminating things to say about several similar analyses of the case due to Philip Kitcher, Douglas Jesseph, Priest and Richard Routley, Richard Arthur, Paolo Mancosu, C. H. Edwards, Henk Bos, O. Bradley Bassler, Sam Levey, Fritz Nagel, Shaughan Lavine and Niccolò Guicciardini. However, as I was heading toward the end of the chapter, I wanted to hear more about the deeper philosophical/metaphysical underpinnings of the positions adopted by the various actors involved here. Take, for instance, Leibniz, and the suggestion that he embraced a form of fictionalism about infinitesimals. I find this very interesting, and I can think of quite a few questions to ask here -- Was this an ad hoc position to adopt? Does this position square well with the central aspects of his philosophy? Had this 'as if' stance influenced other mathematical/philosophical work he did, and how? etc. -- questions which, regrettably, are not asked. I can of course imagine good reasons for which Vickers didn't want to get into these muddier waters (one can say only so much, even in a book), but this doesn't stop me from regretting not having the opportunity to learn more about these aspects.

Let me close by reiterating how much the book does manage to say, both historically and philosophically, and how well it makes the case for its main theses. This is a fine piece of work indeed, well-balanced in terms of the organization of the material in chapters and subchapters, with an informative index. Alas, there is one typo in a crucial place: on page 150, the numerator should have been f(x+o) minus f(x); the correct expression appears on page 154.


I thank Dr. Vickers for commenting on a draft of this review.