Understanding Institutions: The Philosophy and Science of Living Together

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Francesco Guala, Understanding Institutions: The Philosophy and Science of Living Together, Princeton University Press, 2016, 256 pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781400880911.

Reviewed by Mark Risjord, Emory University


For those of us with a naturalistic philosophical bent, the social ontology literature is quite frustrating. The leading approaches draw heavily from intuition pumps and sparingly from social scientific resources. This book is therefore a refreshing contribution to the social ontology landscape. By synthesizing contemporary game theory, economics, and sociology with recent philosophical work, it articulates a viable alternative to the dominant accounts of social ontology.

Guala presents the book as a unification of "the main traditions in the field of social ontology" (p. xix). This is not entirely accurate: it's contribution is best seen as unifying two of the main traditions in opposition to a third. Guala's account, if successful, would unifiy rule-based and equilibrium-based theories of institutions in a way that made joint intentionality-based theories superfluous. Long prevalent in sociology and anthropology, rule-based theories treat an institution as body of explicit or implicit rules. Economists, on the other hand, tend to prefer equilibrium-based accounts. On such accounts, institutions emerge as equilibria of cooperative interactions, modeled using the resources of game theory. Guala's theory blends these by treating rules as "symbolic markers that represent equilibria . . . and help the players use a particular coordination device" (p. 55). The dominant views of social ontology today, by contrast, rest on an analysis of joint intentionality. The importance of this book is to provide an account of institutions that relies only on individualist conceptions of agency and intentionality.

The significance of the volume is not limited to its social ontology. The second half explores the consequences of the rules-in-equilibrium account of institutions for some central issues in the philosophy of the social sciences. It begins with an interesting account of reflexivity, understood in terms of the looping effect. The account of reflexivity, in turn, supports a way in which social phenomena are mind-dependent. Guala's account of the way in which institutions are created and maintained permits him to understand the dependence of institutions on representations in causal terms. The resulting view is a form of realism about institutions. Staking out a wide program in the philosophy of social science, the ultimate aim of the discussion is to ground an account of how institutions may be reformed. Therefore, while the book is in the same tradition of social ontology as Bicchieri's Grammar of Society (2005), it has broader ambitions and engages a wider set of issues.

While neither the general picture nor the specific elements are new, the rules-in-equilibrium account assembles the elements in a novel and potentially powerful way. Guala argues that -- contra Searle -- constitutive rules are not necessary for understanding institutions. Rules have the form of conditionals: if X then do Y. The rules that form institutions are strategies in coordination games. By adding a strategy in the form of a rule to a coordination problem (e.g. "if we have made a pact, then cooperate"), a new strategic situation emerges. By conditioning action on a signal, environmental feature, past patterns, etc., rules create correlated equilibria. Guala calls this the "rules-in-equilibrium" account of institutions.

While he argues that Searle's constitutive rules are not necessary for institutions, he does give them an interesting role. Constitutive rules introduce terms referring to the actions associated with a situation. They have the form "X counts as Y in conditions C," where X is a non-institutional characterization (e.g. a river), Y names the institution (a border). Guala argues that the proper analysis of such rules should be "If C, then X is Y, and if Y then [do] Z" (p. 64). Analyzed this way, constitutive rules do not create new entities. Rather, they create new coordinating devices. By calling a river (X) a "border" (Y), they make salient the correlated equilibrium created by the rules (if Y then do Z).

Using the institutional terms introduced by constitutive rules to represent strategies permits humans to coordinate their behavior in sophisticated ways. When a strategy is represented by a sufficient number of individuals, the institution functions to keep interactions in equilibrium. Institutions thus causally depend on mental representations. Guala takes substantial pains -- indeed, in one of the most sustained arguments of the book -- to distinguish causal dependence from "ontological" dependence. The latter is associated with those views, like Searle's, that make institutions depend on collective acceptance or similar representations of the institution. The point is subtle, but crucial. For Searle, there must be a collective acceptance that, e.g., a river counts as a border. Agents bring borders into existence by representing borders. For Guala, the work is done by beliefs like: "we are south of the river, so we may graze our cattle here." Agents need not have the idea of a border in their representational economy for the institution of a border to exist. Indeed, agents may have largely false beliefs about borders while still following rules that maintain an equilibrium. Institutions are thus causally dependent on representations, yet may be systematically mis-represented.

With a causal account of the dependence of institutions on representations, Guala is able to argue that institutions are real kinds, both in the sense that they are independent of our beliefs about them and that they support inductive inferences and generalizations. Realism about institutions permits Guala to present a broadly Weberian account of the relationship between social change and the social sciences:

If an institution facilitates coordination in a game with multiple equilibria, then it is not inevitable -- there is typically an alternative arrangement to the one that is currently in place. And this means that the institution is potentially open to critique and reform. (p. 139)

Since our beliefs about our institutions may be false, self-reflection has no privileged access to the social world. The equilibrium currently maintained by a given set of institutional rules must be determined empirically. Similarly, whether morally preferable alternative arrangements exist requires social scientific representation. The ultimate choice of institutions is a moral or political matter, not scientific. The rules-in-equilibrium account of institutions thus supports a rather traditional fact/value dichotomy.

This is a lively work with many engaging arguments. Insofar as it falls short, it is because the book itself is too short for its programmatic ambitions. There are many points that deserve a deeper and more nuanced discussion. Naturalists may be disappointed insofar as the book relies heavily on toy examples and conceptual argumentation. The three main examples of "institutions" in the book, marriage, money, and property, are highly stylized and artificial. Since equilibrium accounts have been around so long, it would have been nice to see how the view handles more challenging cases. The book's extended discussion of money is a noteworthy exception; Guala's arguments here are more detailed and grounded in economics. In addition, one would have liked to see the arguments buttressed by the excellent work with behavioral economics Guala has done elsewhere.

Proponents of rule-based accounts of institutions are likely to be dissatisfied with Guala's treatment of normativity. Indeed, they may see the proposed "unification" as nothing more than a reduction of the rules-based account of institutions to an equilibrium-based account. Guala recognizes that the rule "if X, then do Y" has a deontic modality. However, he frames the issue this way: "the question of the deontic power of institutions is whether one should conform to the rule in the first place" (p. 74). He thus treats the issue of deontic power as a matter of moral or political justification. The issue is then set aside on the grounds that a theory of institutions should not depend on taking sides on the nature of normativity. The function of rules is formally represented as constraining action by imposing costs.

Many have argued that assimilating the deontic modalities of "do X" to questions of justification is a mistake. The rules-in-equilibrium account requires humans to represent rules with deontic modality. The relevant question of deontic power is not about the justification of such representations, but their content. The formal representation effectively reduces that deontic content to calculating the costs of transgression. Thus, contrary to its caveats, the book does take a significant stand on the character of normativity, and it does so without sustained argument for its position.

The foregoing remarks are, of course, concerns of interested parties engaged in the debate. The book remains important and deserving of attention in the social ontology debates. While it is not written as a textbook, it would be very useful in the classroom. The lively prose is organized into compact chapters that close with recommended readings. Engaging this book with a group of graduate or advanced undergraduate students would be rewarding for all.


Bicchieri, C. (2005) The Grammar of Society: The Nature and Dynamics of Social Norms. Cambridge University Press.