Understanding Liberal Democracy: Essays in Political Philosophy

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Nicholas Wolterstorff, Understanding Liberal Democracy: Essays in Political Philosophy, Terence Cuneo (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2012, 385pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199558957.

Reviewed by Kelly Sorensen, Ursinus College


Public reason liberalism -- the form of liberalism defended by Rawls, Larmore, Audi, Gaus, Rorty, Nussbaum, and to some degree Habermas -- usually requires citizens to publicly discuss and vote based on only those reasons that pass some sort of test that sifts away religious and comprehensive non-religious reasons. In the public sphere, those with such views are required by the role of citizenship to shape up or shut up -- "shape up" in the sense of offering instead reasons that can or could be shared by all other citizens. Nicholas Wolterstorff argues that public reason liberalism is a dead end, and defends instead what he takes to be a more defensible form of liberalism ("equal political voice liberalism"). His book is fresh and compelling, and an important contribution to political philosophy.

This is a collection of mostly new essays: nine appear for the first time. The remaining six are lightly edited for coherence with the new material. Ten concern public reason liberalism. The rest take up the nature of rights (extending the account that Wolterstorff has been developing in his recent books Justice: Rights and Wrongs and Justice in Love), the nature and source of citizens' political obligations to the state, and other issues in political philosophy.

What motivates public reason liberalism's restrictions on the reasons citizens can express and vote on? One factor is fairness, a second pluralism, and a third a certain kind of realism about pluralism's persistence. Rawls says that we can expect "a pluralism of comprehensive doctrines, including both religious and nonreligious doctrines . . . as the natural outcome of the activities of human reason under enduring free institutions". This pluralism is "not seen as a disaster" (Political Liberalism (​PL), xxiv), but it does raise concerns regarding a fourth factor, the stability of a liberal polity over time. Public reason liberalism sees religious comprehensive views in particular as "not admitting of compromise" and "expansionist" (Rawls), and even "conversation-stopping" and "dangerous" (Rorty). Because of these factors, public reason liberalism says, when it comes to publicly advocating for coercive legislation and voting, a citizen should restrict herself to reasons that she believes all capable adult fellow citizens do endorse or would endorse if they were (variously) better informed, more rational, drawing on a shared fund of premises that are freestanding and neutral with respect to controversial elements of comprehensive views, and so on.

Among Wolterstorff's arguments against public reason liberalism are the following. First, public reason liberalism actually is not realistic enough. One's capable adult fellow citizens clearly do not universally endorse the same reasons. So public reason liberalism has to idealize -- it has to imagine what reasons capable adult fellow citizens would endorse if they met certain hypothetical conditions, with the presumption that a consensus or convergence about these reasons would emerge. The hypothetical conditions vary from one brand of public reason liberalism to another. Suppose the conditions are full information and full rationality. Realistically, why think public reason liberalism is in a position to confidently say what reasons emerge from that idealization, and to say that there would be a consensus about them? Why think disagreement about these reasons will disappear under idealization? We can ask the same of Rawlsian idealization, which is laxer but still unrealistically strong: why think there would be consensus about what processes -- processes of rationally arriving at a set of judgments -- are themselves reasonable? So public reason liberalism is not realistic enough: we are stuck with pluralism, and we cannot idealize our way out of it.

Second, public reason liberalism is paternalistic and patronizing, despite its lip service to respect. Suppose Jones favors some policy on religious reasons that do not qualify as public reasons. Smith, a fan of public reason liberalism, is stuck with telling Jones, "You shouldn't express your reasons in public discussion, and you shouldn't vote on them. Here instead are the kinds of reasons that count -- reasons you would endorse if you were not under-informed and rationally impaired." Jones will of course find this condescending and patronizing. Even if Smith chooses more diplomatic words, public reason liberalism still entails a paternalistic and patronizing view of Jones. It's no surprise if Jones resents such an entailment about his reasons and whether he should express them and vote on them, and that resentment is a problem for the stability that Smith and public reason liberals ostensibly treasure.

A third argument from Wolterstorff is that public reason liberalism cannot consistently get what it wants anyway. Suppose Jones has a religious conviction that he should base his political views on his religious convictions. Jones listens to the arguments and objections of others with different views, but is unconvinced. He is like a Kantian listening to consequentialist arguments: he refuses to think that way. On the one hand, public reason liberals might seem to tell Jones to refrain from public discussion and voting. But on the other hand, that is "not what they should say, given their position as a whole" (100). Public reason liberalism gives citizens a prima facie duty to restrict themselves to public reasons, but in Jones's case that duty is outweighed by what he takes to be an "ultima facie" duty to appeal to his religious reasons. Public reason liberals will have to accept that Jones should reject their "public reason imperative." So public reason liberalism seems to leave Jones free to publicly debate and to vote based on his religious convictions after all  -- the very result that most public reason liberals were attempting to avoid! So it is not possible for public reason liberals, on their own terms, to declare religious reasons inappropriate for public political discourse. There is a tension internal to the theory here.

A related fourth argument concludes that public reason liberalism asks too much of some religious believers. It entails that a piece of coercive legislation's legitimacy depends on Jones having, or counterfactually having, reasons in favor of the legislation that are good and decisive for Jones, the coerced subject. For at least some public reason liberals, it is not enough that Jones knows of public reasons that support the same legislation as his religious reasons; rather, the public reasons must be those on the basis of which Jones actually speaks and votes (36, 80, and 282). But this asks too much, Wolterstorff says. It asks Jones to let non-religious reasons trump his religious reasons when he speaks publicly and goes to the polls.

Fifth, public reason liberalism may caricature religious believers, insofar as it implies that believers are unwilling to go beyond the claim that "God told me that it's wrong so it's wrong." Interestingly, Wolterstorff turns here to qualitative empirical data. In the public discussion in Oregon in the 1990s about a physician-assisted suicide initiative, a leading account reports no such appeals by religious believers. Instead, public discussion in Oregon was characterized by a plurality of more substantive and contentful religious reasons, and also importantly, a plurality of secular reasons (not the supposed universal counterfactual shared premises that public reason liberalism inevitably resorts to).

Sixth, public reason liberalism may also caricature other varieties of liberal democratic engagement. Suppose we turn for a moment from policy deliberation and decision, the favored turf of public reason liberalism, to real-world grassroots organizing. In Maywood, California, city council members instituted an unusually onerous penalty for car drivers without a license: $1200 and a 30-day impound for the car. Towing companies were large donors to the city councilors' campaign funds. The law hit undocumented workers especially hard. Community members and community organizers attempted to use reasons -- public reasons -- to persuade the city council to change the law. That failed. Public reason liberalism seems stuck with the view that people in Maywood at that point should have backed off and shut up. Instead, acting under a plurality of reasons and emotions, including moral outrage, they ran a media campaign to call attention to the city council's corruption, and they registered more voters, until finally the city council members were voted out of office. Public reason liberalism is ill-equipped to theorize about real, non-well-ordered societies like, usually, our own.

These are only brief samples of Wolterstorff's arguments. He offers more sophisticated and detailed versions of these and other arguments when he engages with the specifics of individual theories of Rawls, Rorty, Gaus, Audi, Habermas, and others.

Wolterstorff calls his alternative form of liberal democracy "equal political voice liberalism," and he thinks it better accounts for the "governing idea" found in the longer historical tradition of liberalism, before public reason liberalism seized the spotlight in recent decades. There are two key aspects of equal political voice liberalism. First, citizens speak and vote within a constitutional context -- a context of classic civil liberties, such as freedom of speech, freedom of religious exercise, and freedom of association. Certain fundamental changes in law are appropriately "off the table" in this context of constitutional limits. Second, citizens are to speak and vote with an equal political voice. Intimidation and bullying are out; but otherwise, Wolterstorff's view puts no restrictions on the kinds of reasons to which citizens can appeal in public discussion and voting. That's it: we talk, using whatever reasons we want, religious and non-religious, comprehensive or otherwise, and then we vote. Anyone who wants to persuade others will, as a practical matter, find herself quoting reasons that will appeal to her opponents; but there is no requirement that she restrict herself to some special set of reasons. After the vote, there will be winners and losers. The losers will experience the winners' legislation as coercive. But to have expected otherwise is utopian. And Wolterstorff claims to have uncovered a variety of ways that public reason liberalism leans toward the utopian, despite its putative acceptance of pluralism, realism, and worries about stability.

As to the six issues above, Wolterstorff claims that equal political voice liberalism comes off better. First, it makes no unrealistic claim that, counterfactually, citizens' views on legislation would match some imagined consensus or convergence. Second, it is more respectful and less patronizing to citizens, because it does not tell them that their own reasons are epistemically inadequate. Third, it lets citizens speak and act on their own reasons without internal tension in the theory; and fourth, it does not demand that alien reasons be substituted and decisive. Fifth, the view does not caricature the reasons that people with comprehensive views tend to offer. Sixth, it is not myopic about varieties of democratic engagement -- there is policy deliberation and decision, but there is also broad-based organizing, movement organizing, and protest. Equal political voice liberalism better accounts for what happened in Oregon and in Maywood.

Wolterstorff's equal political voice liberalism does issue some "shape up" talk of its own. While designed to make broader room for religious reasons in the public square, it is not compatible with every religious perspective. Wolterstorff's liberalism does ask thinkers like Egyptian scholar Sayyid Qutb to endorse the constitutional context of liberal democracy and its commitment to not favoring any particular religious tradition. For Wolterstorff, "to affirm the liberal democratic polity is to put the shape of our life together at the mercy of votes in which the infidel has an equal voice with the believer" (295).

A mood of non-utopianism hangs over the book, but Wolterstorff is neither resigned nor pessimistic. Unlike dour critics such as MacIntyre, he loves liberal democracy. He agrees with public reason liberals that pluralism is ineradicable, but claims that there is more respect, more stability, and more positive endorsement of the system, when citizens speak and vote with an equal voice in a context of fundamental constitutional limits.

Equal political voice liberalism seems straightforward and simple, and it certainly has many attractions. Wolterstorff not only puts public reason liberals on the hot seat, but also sketches an alternative that captures important planks of the liberal democratic tradition. But consider a few concerns.

First, equal political voice liberalism seems to assume that after discussing and voting and grassroots organizing, there will be winners and losers, but that often enough the winners will be losers on other matters and the losers will in turn be winners (294). I take it this claim is supposed to address familiar concerns about stability. But it would be utopian to think that this happens often enough. It is easy to imagine places where the losers are very often repeat losers, because a majority persists there that sees little need to engage minority interlocutors. Depending on the place, the repeat losers could either be secular minorities or religious minorities. Wolterstorff will claim otherwise, but the best form of public reason liberalism might have more resources to address this worry than equal political voice liberalism.

Second, the book does not make clear whether Wolterstorff would consider an issue like state-authorized gay marriage to be part of the constitutional context, properly understood, and so part of the basic civil liberties that are "off the table" for democratic alteration by vote, or instead to be up for public discussion and a vote. From his discussion of the Oregon physician-assisted suicide case, we might think Wolterstorff would go for the latter, but personal correspondence indicates that he believes the former. In any case, even more specificity about what is off the table and what is on would be good.

Third, maybe things are not so bleak for public reason liberals, if they up their game and amend certain claims. Consider what we might call aspirational public reason liberalism. This theory is "aspirational" in three distinct ways. First, aspirational public reason liberalism asks citizens to aspire to offer reasons that are more general and broadly held than their own particular comprehensive-view-based reasons. But unlike the forms of liberalism that Wolterstorff's first argument addresses, it does not rely on the idea of a universal consensus or convergence about public reasons. Second, aspirational public reason liberalism does not require or demand  that citizens restrict themselves to these more general public reasons, but it does ask them to aspire to offer them. Citizens do nothing forbidden or wrongful if they articulate religious or other comprehensive view reasons, but they fulfill the role of citizen well if they also offer more general reasons -- reasons that speak to a broader swath of fellow citizens. A third aspiration concerns the place of these more general reasons among the citizen's individual motives: aspirational public reason liberalism says that these more general reasons need not be decisive for the citizen when she speaks and votes. We might also add a Rawlsian scope restriction: these aspirations apply to "most cases of constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice" (PL, xxi), not necessarily to all matters of public discussion.

I believe this form of public reason liberalism survives most of Wolterstorff's objections. It leaves room for many of his key points, including realism about the nature of lived citizenship and public activism, and also openness to religious comprehensive views as historically a fecund source of generalizable moral insight. It preserves many of the attractions of public reason liberalism as well, including an ideal of the role of citizen and the role's coercive power that encourages robust respect for other members of the polity. Consider Rawls's claim that "Public reason sees the office of citizen with its duty of civility as analogous to that of judgeship with its duty of deciding cases" (PL, liii). The citizen who fulfills her office well will aspire to articulate reasons that go beyond her personal reasons -- a good citizen will do this not, as Wolterstorff's equal political voice liberalism says, on a mere practical and rhetorical basis; and a good citizen will do this even when she is part of a repeat-winner majority, when on Wolterstorff's view there is no practical reason for her to do so.[1] The judge/citizen analogy may not be as tight as Rawls seems to think: the role of judge comes with heavy demands of neutrality, while citizens face less onerous aspirations. In any case, it's worth noting, as Wolterstorff does, that in the 1995 introduction to the paperback edition of PL, Rawls does begin to soften. He says there that he now believes that reasons based on comprehensive doctrines "may be introduced in public reason at any time, provided that in due course public reasons, given by a reasonable political conception, are presented sufficient to support whatever the comprehensive doctrines are introduced to support" (PL, xlix). This isn't yet aspirational public reason liberalism, but it begins to point in that direction.

Whether or not public reason liberalism can be patched up in this or other ways, Wolterstorff's essays certainly reveal important undigested entailments in the standard view. This really is an excellent book.

Nearly half the book takes up other topics, and I regret that I have not managed to discuss them. For instance, Wolterstorff's discussion of privacy rights is particularly important. Take the case of J. Edgar Hoover's spying on Martin Luther King, Jr. Hoover secretly taped King's personal conversations and sex life. Suppose for a moment that King never knew of the privacy invasions, and so made no decisions in light them; suppose Hoover made the recordings for his own prurient enjoyment. (In fact, the FBI did try to blackmail King with these materials, as David Garrow's biography of King indicates. Wolterstorff notes this in one place (223), but not in another (326).) Standard accounts usually try to explain rights violations in terms of constriction of the rights holder's normative agency, or of his freedom of opinion and action. But in the imagined case, King's normative agency was not so affected. Still, his rights clearly were violated. Standard accounts of rights cannot adequately explain the wrongfulness of privacy violation, or the depth of the wrongness of rape, and are accordingly deficient.

Another chapter concerns the nature and source of the political authority of the state -- the state's authority to issue binding directives to its citizens. This issue, long a mainstay in political philosophy, largely dropped out of discussion a few decades ago. Wolterstorff resurrects it and offers an interesting new account.

Wolterstorff's prose and thinking are clear. The book would work well in an upper-level undergraduate or graduate course on liberalism.[2]

[1] In personal correspondence, Wolterstorff says that he does believe that citizens are under a moral demand to engage others, although a failure to so engage is not a violation of the governing idea of liberal democracy.

[2] My thanks to Nick Wolterstorff and Apryl Martin for their feedback on an earlier version of this review.