Understanding Marxism

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Geoff Boucher, Understanding Marxism, Acumen, 2012, 240pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844655212.

Reviewed by Daniel Little, University of Michigan-Dearborn


At various points since the death of Karl Marx in 1883 his work has been regarded as a dead issue -- no longer relevant, too ideological, methodologically flawed, too rooted in the nineteenth century. And yet each of these periods of extinction has been followed by a resurgence of interest in Marx's ideas, as new generations try to make sense of the tough and often cruel social conditions in which they find themselves. What are the important dimensions of theory that Marx presented through his writings? And how can any of these be considered valuable in trying to come to grips with the global, capitalist, turbulent, unequal, violent world that we now inhabit?

Geoff Boucher takes up the issue of the continuing relevance of Marx in the contemporary world. His summary assessment is: "Marxism as an intellectual movement has been one of the most important and fertile contributions to twentieth-century thought. The influence of Marxism has been felt in every discipline, in the social sciences and interpretive humanities, from philosophy, through sociology and history, to literature" (2). According to Boucher, this tradition provides a more incisive basis for understanding the modern world than any other on offer. His book provides an excellent basis for reviewing and reconsidering the large branches of Marxist thinking about the complex reality of contemporary capitalist society.

Much of Boucher's book contributes to one of two intellectual aims: to give a clear exposition of the most important of Marx's theoretical ideas, and to explicate and motivate the several "Marxisms" that followed in the twentieth century. The successive Marxisms take up the bulk of the book, with chapters on Classical Marxism, Hegelian Marxism, the Frankfurt School, Structural Marxism, Analytical Marxism, Critical Theory, and Post-Marxism. So the book provides an extensive and nuanced explication of the theoretical ideas and developments that have grown out of the Marxist tradition. Ultimately Boucher is more interested in Marxism than Marx; that is, he finds the intellectual and political developments that followed Marx's initial program to be of greater continuing interest that the original program itself.

The account that Boucher gives of Marx's social theory in chapter one is succinct but clear and accurate. It serves as a good introduction to Marx's thought, and describes something of the context out of which it emerged. Boucher provides a reasonable account of Marx's ideas of dialectics, alienation, species being, the labor theory of value, historical materialism, ideology, class, and the state. He also argues that Marx's writings provide evidence for a proto-feminism within his social theory -- a claim that seems to stretch credulity a bit. (Much of this argument depends on the positions that Friedrich Engels develops in The Origin of the Family, Private Property and the State, which appeared in 1884 after Marx's death.) Chapter two explores the efforts made by Engels and others to systematize Marx's theories after his death, including the effort to explicate the idea that Marx's system was "scientific." Boucher gives a fair amount of attention to more recent interpretations of Marx's intellectual system, including Popper's criticisms of Marx and Gerald Cohen's treatment of Marx's theory of historical materialism (Karl Marx's Theory of History: A Defence; Princeton, 1978).

Several chapters focus on a range of non-orthodox Marxist thinkers, including Lukács and Gramsci (chapter three) and Marcuse, Horkheimer, and Adorno (chapter four). One thread that unifies these chapters is the introduction of "culture" into the Marxist discourse. The authors of the Frankfurt School provided a basis for understanding both the function of culture and its relative autonomy from the forces and relations of production; Gramsci emphasized the ways in which "hegemony" works to channel class politics in unexpected directions; and Lukács provided a broadly-speaking materialist framework for understanding literature and high culture.

The writings of Althusser, Balibar, and Poulantzas are the focus of chapter five. Boucher presents some of the key theoretical elements of structural Marxism -- the mode of production, the social formation, the nature of class, determination in the last instance, and the ideological state apparatus. He finds substantive importance in this line of thought, writing that "structural Marxism was one of the most fertile and inventive of the twentieth century's efforts to generate a renaissance in historical materialism" (131). Boucher's description of the key ideas of these authors is once again clear and accurate.

A very different approach to the interpretation and extension of Marx's thought is taken up in chapter six, under the heading of analytical Marxism. This is the movement of the 1970s of analytically trained philosophers and social scientists who wanted to "make sense of Marx" (in Elster's phrase; Making Sense of Marx; Cambridge, 1985) without accepting the underlying Hegelian methodologies that Marxism often proposed. This was also referred to as "rational choice Marxism," as theorists like Elster, Roemer, Van Parijs, Przeworski, and others attempted to reproduce key Marxist ideas like exploitation and class using the conceptual tools of orthodox social science. Here again, Boucher's account is fair and accurate, and provides the reader who is unfamiliar with this literature with a reasonably well-grounded outline of the key assumptions. As Boucher points out, this literature began in a discussion of the topic of Marx's attitude towards the theory of justice, with important contributions from philosophers such as Allen Buchanan and (unmentioned by Boucher) Allen Wood and George Brenkert.

Habermas is the subject of chapter seven, as the most important representative of what Boucher calls "the second generation of the Frankfurt School" (183). Other theorists in this group include Axel Honneth, Albrecht Wellmer, Seyla Benhabib, and Claus Offe. Though Boucher's text is reasonably even-handed, it seems clear that the writings of Habermas resonate strongly with Boucher's own convictions. He gives particular attention to Habermas's theories of "legitimation crises" (191) and communicative action. Boucher paraphrases Habermas's most general theoretical goals in these terms: "An interdisciplinary, materialist research programme, one that aims at an emancipatory critical theory with a practical intent, must seek to unite the critique of domination with the question of a meaningful existence, in the context of a focus on human suffering" (184).

The book closes with a treatment of several philosophers and theorists who fall in a category that Boucher refers to as "post-Marxism" -- a group of thinkers to whom the ideas of Marx and Marxism are crucially important, but who reconfigure those ideas to better suit contemporary society. "[This movement] explicitly essays a reconstruction of Marxism, one designed to retrieve its emancipatory impulse under specific historical and intellectual conditions" (215). Within this group Boucher refers to Ernesto Laclau, Chantal Mouffe, Slavoj Žižek, Judith Butler, Jacques Rancière, and Alain Badiou. Boucher takes a favorable view of this contemporary style of theory: "Alongside Analytical Marxism and Critical Theory, post-Marxism represents a provocative and challenging effort to reconstruct the project of the left while preserving the emancipatory impulse of Marxism" (216).

It is evident that Boucher's main reasons for thinking that Marx and Marxism remain relevant today reside largely at the level of social theory and critique. His book is a history of Marxist theory through the twists and turns that it took in the twentieth century. The Marxisms of the past century, according to Boucher, have provided rich resources for analyzing and critiquing the modern realities of capitalist society and culture. One might say, however, that this remains at the level of philosophy. On this line of thought, Marxism provides an alternative to neoliberal thought as a framing set of ideas about the modern world -- what Boucher refers to as a "normative social-theoretical challenge to liberal forms of freedom" (2). But this analysis does not necessarily allow us to move beyond philosophy into concrete social science theory and political strategy. It does not provide a foundation for what Erik Olin Wright refers to as "practical utopias" -- the deliberate design and pursuit of a more satisfactory social order (Envisioning Real Utopias; Verso, 2010).

What Boucher does not provide is a clear rationale, based on contemporary sociology and history, for the conclusions he wants us to share about the continuing utility of Marxism as an empirical framework for understanding the present and future. We do not get the reasoning that would support the affirmative ideas expressed above in the context of historical research and the social sciences. The best rebuttal to the neoliberal triumphalism mentioned above is a compelling collection of sociological studies grounded in the perspectives mentioned above. E. P. Thompson's masterful study of class (The Making of the English Working Class; Gollanz, 1963), Ralph Miliband's study of the contemporary capitalist state (The State in Capitalist Society; Basic, 1969), and Michael Burawoy's sociology of factories (Manufacturing Consent: Changes in the Labor Process Under Monopoly Capitalism; University of Chicago, 1979) are good examples of the value that Marxian ideas have for guiding concrete research, and there are many others. But this is not an approach that Boucher chooses to pursue.

Are these ideas and theories in the Marxist tradition still relevant in the contemporary world? The inequalities we see in the current economy certainly suggest the idea of exploitation of someone; wealth is being created and a large proportion of it is flowing to a small privileged group. Power is visibly concentrated in contemporary society -- whether it comes to legislation, regulation, or the influence of the media. This implies a degree of domination on the part of a small segment of society -- a "ruling elite". And few would doubt that there seems to be a growing sense of value-less-ness in contemporary society -- a condition strikingly like what Marx described as alienation. So it certainly seems timely for all of us to sharpen our critical skills and help figure out what we need to do to create the foundations of a more just and more humanly satisfying social order. The Marxisms that Boucher describes provide rich resources for doing so.

A common thread running through the framing ideas of Marx and Marxism is the perspective of critique: a critical intelligence trying to understand why modern society produces such human misery. But even from the perspective of critique -- the perspective that tries to diagnose and understand the systemic flaws of contemporary society -- Marxism leaves quite a bit of terrain untouched: gender relations, racism, nationalism, and religious hatred, for example. Marxism does not do a good job of explaining a regime of sexual violence (rape in India); it does not have much to contribute to understanding the rise of fascism; it does not have resources for understanding Islamo-phobia and hatred. So Marxism is not a comprehensive theory of modern social failings, and we might say that its emphasis on economic conflict eclipses other forms of domination in ways that are sometimes harmful to our ability to improve our social relations.

So what about it? Is Marxism relevant today? Yes, if we can avoid the dogmatism and rigidity that were often associated with the tradition. Power, exploitation, class, structures of production and distribution, property relations, workplace hierarchy -- these features certainly continue to be an important part of our social world. We need to think of Marx's corpus and its successors as a multiple source of hypotheses and interpretations about how capitalism works. And we need to recognize fully that no theoretical framework captures the whole of history or society. Marxism is not a comprehensive theory of social organization and change. But it does provide a useful set of hypotheses about how some of the key social mechanisms work in a class-divided society. Seen from that perspective, Marxist thought serves as a sort of proto-paradigm or mental framework in terms of which to pursue more specific social and historical investigations. And, as Boucher emphasizes throughout, this paradigm is intimately connected to a passionate commitment to emancipation that can help lead us to a more democratic and equal world.