Understanding Naturalism

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Jack Ritchie, Understanding Naturalism, Acumen, 2008, 218pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844650798.

Reviewed by David Macarthur, The University of Sydney



Naturalism is the current orthodoxy within Anglo-American philosophy, an outlook that shapes the way philosophers understand the mission and problems of philosophy. But what is naturalism? This is not an easy question to answer although the general outlines of an answer are clear. Naturalism wants to make philosophy properly responsive to the successes of modern science (rather than traditional philosophy) in providing fruitful explanations and extensive knowledge of natural phenomena. It also wants to make sense of the human condition in non-supernatural terms. Ritchie takes these two tasks to align so that making philosophical sense of ourselves and our world is best approached by looking to science, and only science, for guidance. But how is one to go beyond a general attitude of admiration for science or chanting such vague slogans as “Philosophy is continuous with science” and “There is no first philosophy”? Ritchie’s clearly written, well-exampled and engaging book is an attempt to answer this question by distinguishing various kinds of naturalism within the landscape of contemporary scientific naturalism and by providing an overview of some of the most prominent naturalistic projects and programs over the past 50 years concerning knowledge, ontology, science, mind, meaning and truth. Collected volumes have covered this ground before but this is the first book that I am aware of to do so from a single point of view.

Not all topics of interest are covered, however. There is only a brief discussion of naturalism in the philosophy of mathematics, and none at all of naturalistic ethics, a surprising omission given the prominence of the debates about naturalism in this region of thought. The book does not attempt to address itself to anti-naturalist doctrines and tendencies within the wider culture, whether antiscientific, superstitious or religious. Although naturalists of all stripes are anti-supernaturalists, this book does not explore supernaturalism or its negation, anti-supernaturalism (which Ritchie calls popular naturalism). The significant philosophical issues are taken to lie elsewhere although it must be admitted that it is not at all clear what “supernatural” means.

The book is an introductory text addressed primarily to students and naturalists. It is, moreover, an opinionated introduction that argues for a particular version of naturalism, deflationary methodological naturalism, inspired by Arthur Fine’s Natural Ontological Attitude (NOA), the motto of which is: “try to take science on its own terms, and try not to read things into science” (3). Ritchie’s brand of naturalism takes a stand against analytic metaphysicians such as Armstrong, Jackson and Lewis, who appeal to science as a basis for their constructive metaphysical programs. His main claim is that if we are honest in our appeal to actual scientific practices rather than merely paying lip-service to such an aspiration, or misguidedly employing mythical or ideological conceptions of science then we will find there is, on balance, no scientific support for substantial metaphysical conclusions embodied in such prominent ‘-isms’ as physicalism, scientific realism, modal realism and mathematical Platonism.

A brief summary of the contents of the book follows. The introduction distinguishes various senses of “nature” or the “natural” in contrast to the supernatural, the artificial and the normative. The opening chapter gives a brief sketch of two first philosophy problems, skepticism and induction, and two first philosophy responses, the transcendental idealism of Kant and the logical positivism of Carnap. Chapters 2 and 3 consider naturalized epistemology in its Quinean and reliabilist versions. Chapter 4 takes up the issue of naturalistic conceptions of science in the wake of Kuhn, Feyerabend and Laudan. Chapter 5 considers philosophers such as Papineau and Melnyk who tend to identify naturalism with physicalism or at least think that the former provides strong grounds for the latter. The problems for physicalism from subjectivity (Nagel), qualia (Jackson), consciousness (Chalmers) and lack of empirical support (Cartwright) are the subject of chapter 6. In chapter 7 there is a consideration of naturalistic approaches to meaning and truth in the writings of Quine, Dretske, Millikan, Horwich and Price. The conclusion provides a short synopsis of the kinds and prospects of naturalism.

Although Ritchie’s treatment of each of these topics is worthy of extended discussion, in this review I have chosen to comment on five main themes:

1. The Ontology/Methodology Distinction. Ritchie distinguishes, as is customary, metaphysical (or ontological) naturalism from methodological naturalism. Metaphysical naturalists “start not with scientific method but a view about how the world is — a view that they claim is derived from our best science” (196-7). It comes in either physicalist or non-physicalist versions. On the other hand, “Methodological naturalists think that the methods of science should be as far as possible adopted by philosophers” (196). Constructive methodological naturalists, of which Armstrong and Lewis are representatives, appeal to inference to the best explanation to justify strong metaphysical conclusions about, say, universals and possible worlds. There is, in additon, a deflationary version.

Contrary to what Ritchie suggests, the distinction he draws between metaphysical and methodological naturalism is not exclusive. One can be both a metaphysical and methodological naturalist. Armstrong, for example, also counts as metaphysical naturalist since he subscribes to an a priori ontological principle: a causal criterion of existence. Indeed, following a suggestion of Ritchie’s, since philosophers (and many scientists outside their own area of expertise) are not aware of the relevant scientific standards of ontological commitment, it is all too easy to count as a metaphysical naturalist if that simply means having anything but an insider’s view about the posits of a particular science. What philosopher does not start with a (provisional) view about how the world is? Given the vagaries of what counts as scientific method, our imperfect grasp of it and the inevitability of some initial view of how things are, Ritchie’s way of drawing the distinction between metaphysical and methodological naturalism is unworkable.

2. The Anti-Metaphysical Theme. Ritchie’s discussion does, however, suggest a more useful distinction, that between metaphysically inflationary and metaphysically deflationary naturalisms. Ritchie takes seriously that for the consistent naturalist there is no first philosophy. In so far as metaphysics is extraneous to actual science then the “good naturalist should … be suspicious of such metaphysics” (153). Ritchie’s general criticism of allegedly naturalistic analytic metaphysics is that it gains an unearned cachet from presuming to follow the results and methods of the successful sciences. Regarding metaphysically inflationary naturalists, the commitment to naturalism is really just window dressing since “there is no general metaphysical picture that our best science supports” (158). The attitude Ritchie recommends for the genuine or serious naturalist is metaphysical agnosticism (cf. 104, 143, 148, 158). Like Fine’s NOA, the naturalist should not take sides in the metaphysical debates between physicalists and nonphysicalists, or between “realists” and “antirealists” about theoretical posits, universals, possible worlds, numbers, and the like. Metaphysics wants to tell us how things must be, or can be, once and for all, but “science forces us to revise our conceptions of what is and is not possible, of where a concept can be meaningfully deployed and where it can’t” (147). Further, it is idle speculation to try to foresee how our future science might develop. Philosophy should purge itself of scientific soothsaying. In light of these considerations Ritchie interestingly suggests a reconception of metaphysics as metaphor: “Thinking of metaphysical theories as inspirational pictures or metaphors strikes me as … perhaps the best way to understand how science and metaphysics relate to one another from a deflationary naturalist perspective” (158).

Ritchie’s deflationary methodological naturalism takes the sciences “at face value” (109). From this perspective the “strong disanalogy” between the standards of ontological commitment of the sciences and those of metaphysically inflationary naturalists (e.g. Quine, Armstrong and Lewis) is disastrous for these metaphysical programs (109). A naturalist is enjoined to stick as closely as possible to the results and methods of the sciences. When pondering the existence of some entity scientists themselves do not rest content with considerations of indispensability and explanatory worth. They also demand the right kind of empirical confirmation. We are asked, for example, to consider the experiments of Jean Baptiste Perrin in the aftermath of Einstein’s work on Brownian motion, which allowed us for the first time to “see” atoms and thereby settle widespread skepticism about their existence. Ritchie suggests that science itself is more empirically minded than many naturalists suppose. [Aside: how would this appeal to empirical support help when it comes to the existence of abstract entities such as numbers or concepts?] In general, for the deflationary naturalist there is no unified story to tell about what exists: all he can do is to endorse “the many different things that our many empirically well-supported sciences say about the world” (158).

3. The Question of Self-Consistency. In Ritchie’s eyes, metaphysically inflationary naturalists are not naturalistic enough by their own lights. Although they claim to be naturalists opting for a properly scientific philosophy, they actually subscribe to false or outdated or mythic views of science. To make matters worse, they have a too loose sense of what it is to follow the results and methods of the sciences. A consistent naturalism must hold more closely to the sciences — their variety and the multiplicity of their results and methods. This is not something that can be done from the armchair. It requires adopting an empirical attitude to the sciences themselves and learning from actual scientific case histories and examples (cf. 71, 90). However, “taking science on its own terms is not something philosophers have had much practice at” (5). Studies of “the history of science refute … the most popular methodologies of science”, namely, inductivisim and hypothetico-deductivism (81). They also undermine constructive metaphysical programs, including philosophical speculations about the relation between mind and matter, at least within a naturalistic setting.

Another problem of self-consistency arises from within the philosophy of language. It seems a plausible constraint on naturalism that it not make substantial assumptions about the functions of various concepts or discourses prior to empirical inquiry. But orthodox naturalists treat scientific discourses as representing the way the world is anyway. Several considerations (e.g. deflationary accounts of semantic notions, the failures of representationalist programs) suggest that an anthropological inquiry into linguistic functions — what Huw Price calls “subject naturalism” — will not validate the naturalistic prior commitment to representationalism. Again, orthodox naturalists are convicted of not being naturalistic enough by their own lights.

4. The Problem of Explaining Normativity. Since “science … is full of norms” and norms seem to find no place in the scientific image of the world, what are naturalists to make of normative and evaluative claims (cf. 44)? Laudan’s (and Quine’s) response to this is to render norms within science as a matter of empirically testable hypothetical imperatives of the form, “If one’s goal is y then one ought to do x” (83). Given an empirically established link between y and x we arrive at this inductive rule:

® If actions of a particular sort, x, have consistently promoted certain cognitive ends, y, in the past, and rival actions, z, have failed to do so then future actions following the rule “If your aim is y, then you ought to do x” are more likely to promote those ends than actions based on the rule “If your aim is y, then you ought to do z”. (87)

Ritchie seems sanguine about the prospects of this sort of account. But what about moral norms? Or the norms of rationality itself? In particular, how would this sort of account explain the normativity of kinds of reasoning (e.g. moral, aesthetic, or mathematical reasoning) the rightness of which is not based on empirically established generalizations or laws? In abstract areas such as mathematics, logic and ethics, where there are no empirical tests of one’s reasoning, all we seem able to say in general about method is that we must ‘think carefully in the right way’.

It is also hard to explain why we normatively aim at truth on naturalistic grounds. Presumably the naturalist thinks that this is to be explained as no more than a contingent desire for the truth. In that case rational normativity would be conditional upon one’s actually having such a desire. But it makes no sense to think that aiming at the truth is optional for a thinker. To see this suppose one does not have the desire for truth. Still one is a reasoner, hence a believer, and to believe P is to believe It is true that P. The relation between belief and truth is conceptual, not contingent. The goal of truth, far from being optional, is presupposed in the very idea of having beliefs. Ritchie admits, without explanation, “that making sense of the normative is the hardest task for naturalists” (7).

5. The Emptiness of Physicalism. Physicalism in its various guises is understood in terms of the posits of physics, but what do we mean by “physics” in this context? (pp153) Ritchie argues that this is a lot less clear than many philosophers tend to assume. Either we mean current physics or a completed (hence imaginary) physics. This gives rise to a dilemma: the first conception is “almost certainly false” based on induction from the history of science; and the second is contentless, its completeness vacuously definitional. If we reject both alternatives then we have a we-know-not-what kind of physics! The moral is: “We have no clear content for the physics of physicalism” (157). This is an important point but a more direct argument against the doctrine (or at least versions stronger than weak global supervenience) is the naturalist’s prima facie commitment to all the posits of the many explanatorily fruitful natural and human sciences. The default position for the naturalist is ontological pluralism. It is also worth noting that Ritchie does not criticize causal fundamentalism, the idea that there is a single physical causal order, which is a key premise in the causal closure argument for physicalism. Recent work on causation suggests that this premise is false and that science is prima facie committed to causal pluralism and the existence of different levels of causal explanation.

6. What is the Future for Naturalism? A preliminary question for any kind of naturalist is to give some account of the supernatural. This is important unfinished business for Ritchie since he seems to include abstract entities within the class of the supernatural despite the fact that hard-headed naturalists like Quine take science to be committed to them. Furthermore, how is a consistent naturalism to avoid simply melting into science? Ritchie argues that one important philosophical task is to investigate the methods of the various sciences in order that we may better follow them. But if philosophy is in the business of metaphor-mongering why should it want to? One suggestion is that philosophical naturalism can interpret and criticize science so long as it does not assume an epistemically privileged position. But of course this task would require significant scientific training.

Ritchie’s strategy of taking up a position within the landscape of current scientific naturalism, however, leads to a blindspot about the range of viable naturalisms on offer in contemporary philosophy. He misses the possibility of a non-scientific or liberal naturalism that is arguably associated with such leading philosophers as Dewey, McDowell, Putnam and Wittgenstein. Such naturalism lies in the largely unexplored conceptual space between scientific naturalism and supernaturalism. It allows that one can respect science without supposing that science is our only resource for understanding humanity. Not everything that exists is explicable, or fully explicable, by science. There are many things in our everyday world of which there is no complete scientific theory but that are, nonetheless, presupposed by science — e.g. tables, persons, artworks, institutions, rational norms. A liberal naturalism can more readily do justice to such things. It is also in a better position to ask whether there exist non-scientific modes of knowing and understanding tables, persons, reasons, etc. The best prospects for an account of rational or conceptual normativity (“the hardest task”) are, presumably, neither scientific nor supernatural.

To conclude, this book is a very useful overview of various kinds of scientific naturalism and their relevance to contemporary debates in central areas of philosophy. One of its chief virtues is in exposing orthodox naturalism as a king with no clothes. Ritchie convincingly shows that many naturalists cling to misconceptions about science, its methods, and what is required if one is seriously to take science as our guide in matters of epistemology and ontology. He argues that a consistent naturalism, far from being a form of reductive physicalism or, indeed, any kind of inflationary metaphysics, is actually committed to metaphysical agnosticism. And he makes a case for deflationary methodological naturalism as at least one viable option for the future of naturalism. It should be required reading for any course or seminar studying the varieties and future direction of contemporary scientific naturalism.