Understanding Nietzscheanism

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Ashley Woodward, Understanding Nietzscheanism, Acumen, 2011, 272pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652938.

Reviewed by Richard White, Creighton University


Understanding Nietzscheanism is a highly readable account of Nietzsche's ongoing influence in various fields of contemporary thought. It is a useful guide which covers a lot of different material. In my judgment, it is accurate and well-organized. Some chapters are definitely stronger than others, and the "text-book" structure is distracting. But overall, this book is highly recommended.

After an initial chapter summarizing the basic themes in Nietzsche's philosophy, Ashley Woodward discusses Nietzsche's influence on existentialism, poststructuralism, politics, feminism, theology, posthumanism and science. All of these chapters are well-written, and taken together they represent an impressive feat of synthesis: on the one hand, it isn't easy to discuss Nietzsche's influence on existentialism or poststructuralism in a relatively short work without dramatically oversimplifying things; on the other hand, there is also a tendency among commentators to redescribe difficult texts and ideas in such a way that leaves them just as complex as they were to begin with. Certainly, anyone who is coming to grips with these thinkers -- Deleuze, Klossowski, Foucault, Irigaray, Kofman, Kaufmann, Derrida etc. -- or who is thinking about a research program on Nietzsche needs a guide that will help to map out some of the territory in advance. And in this respect, Understanding Nietzscheanism could be an extremely useful tool insofar as it clearly and thoughtfully articulates Nietzsche's legacy at this point in time. As Woodward puts it, "This book may be understood as a kind of map, the chapters of which chart some of the most prominent islands in the Nietzschean archipelago to which some explorers in the realms of thought have followed him, and have begun to chart." (p. 25)

Understanding Nietzscheanism is one of a series of books aimed at students and researchers. Not beginning students, who need more basic grounding, and who would not necessarily follow the summary accounts of such difficult ideas, but those who already have some understanding of Nietzsche's philosophy and who want to follow the legacy of his thinking. The book's format loosely resembles a more traditional text book with "key points" framed inside boxes; a summary of key points at the end of each chapter; questions for discussion and revision at the end of the book -- for example, "What is Deleuze's "logic of difference" and how does it differ from a logic of opposition?" and "Summarize the important points on which Bataille's and Klossowski's readings of Nietzsche influenced the poststructuralists"; there are also detailed suggestions for future reading and an extensive bibliography. This format suggests something along the lines of CliffsNotes, or "philosophy made simple," but the book is actually much more interesting than this. It really does not need all the boxes and key points, which suggest that it is another kind of book entirely.

Given the very nature of this book, as a sort of "reader's guide," there is not a lot of space for different interpretations, and the reader is not encouraged to argue with the text. For example, in the introductory chapter Woodward asserts that nihilism is the key to understanding Nietzsche's oeuvre, and that, "Nietzsche's philosophy may be seen to have a degree of coherence in so far as it revolves around the central concept of nihilism." (p. 6) Nothing is tentative here, and the presentation of ideas is quite brisk. But it must be said that the book is clear and well-written, and it would certainly be of interest to anyone who wants a sense of the big picture: To what extent does Nietzsche's philosophy still continue to inspire modern thought? In politics, science and theology -- as well as philosophy -- how do Nietzsche's ideas continue to affect the way that people think?

Woodward makes an excellent case for the timeliness of Nietzsche's work. Perhaps more than any other nineteenth-century thinker, Nietzsche's views are still debated and his thoughts are still shaping a variety of different intellectual fields. I would have to say that the best chapters in the book deal with this sense of Nietzscheanism as an ongoing phenomenon. For example, Nietzsche's influence on poststructuralism is indisputable: Foucault thought of himself as a Nietzschean doing modern-day genealogy; Derrida regarded Nietzsche as his intellectual precursor, a deconstructionist avant la lettre; the excitement of Deleuze's philosophy is expressly predicated on the liberation achieved by Nietzsche's own thinking. In his chapter on poststructuralism, Woodward's discussion is engaging and accurate, and it would be helpful to any reader who was trying to figure out underlying themes, and the respect in which this whole line of thinking is essentially Nietzschean in character. Other outstanding chapters include those on existentialism, theology and posthumanism. In his Acknowledgements, Woodward tells us that much of the material for this book was developed in a course that he recently taught entitled, "Nietzsche's Legacy: Existentialism, Poststructuralism, Transhumanism." It is no surprise that this book has emerged at the intersection of teaching and research. The focus on Nietzsche's legacy makes for a very coherent course that I would also love to take -- or teach -- at some point.

Much of the book consists in detailed summaries of different positions. Usually, this is very helpful because Woodward has a knack for clarifying difficult material without oversimplifying it, and one is left with a strong impression of Nietzscheanism as an ongoing movement of thought. With some chapters, however, including the chapter on Nietzsche and science, or parts of the chapters on Nietzsche and politics or Nietzsche and feminism, the connections that he makes are more tenuous and less convincing. The chapter, "Nietzscheanism, Naturalism, Science," for example, is not so much about Nietzsche's influence on contemporary science (which is slight if any), but involves discussion of a few recent essays and other texts which have tried to show Nietzsche's relevance for the whole scientific enterprise; or the extent to which Nietzsche may have been a naturalist, and if so, what kind of a naturalist was he? It is an interesting problem to figure out how much science Nietzsche actually knew, and whether he was a methodological naturalist or an interpretive naturalist (Brian Leiter or Christoph Cox). But now, the discussion becomes more of a literature review than the tracing of a dominant tendency called Nietzscheanism. It's not Nietzsche on science that is the focus here, but the scientific influences on Nietzsche's philosophy, such as Lange, Darwin and Lamarck. The same kind of problem exists with the chapter on Nietzsche and politics. "Is there such a thing as Nietzscheanism in politics?" is a very different question from "What was Nietzsche's political position?" Woodward focuses on the second question to discuss the work of scholars who are trying to determine whether Nietzsche was apolitical, a democrat or a reactionary. But apart from the Nazi misappropriation of his texts, I don't think there has been a Nietzschean tradition in politics, and this chapter is more about Nietzsche and his own elusive political position than Nietzsche's influence on political life.

More positively, however, it is obvious that Nietzsche's account of the overman must be of particular interest to those who are working in the field of transhumanism or posthumanist studies. Nietzsche urged going beyond man as he has been hitherto, but what exactly does this mean for the future of humankind, especially given recent developments in biotechnology, cloning and robotics? Does "can" imply "ought" here -- as Žižek seems to suggest elsewhere -- or does the situation require more caution? What would Nietzsche think? Personally, I found this chapter the most intriguing and the most interesting in Woodward's book, probably because it helped to illuminate an aspect of Nietzsche's work -- or Nietzsche's influence -- that I really did not know that much about. The chapter on Nietzsche's influence on theology was also quite informative. Woodward outlines a genealogy that includes Barth, Tillich, Buber, Altizer and the death of God movement in theology. This much is fairly well-known. But then he looks at some contemporary authors in more detail, including Gianni Vattimo who subscribes to a more tentative theological position -- "I believe that I believe" -- which is profoundly influenced by Nietzsche's account of nihilism and the death of god. Also of interest in this chapter: a discussion of some recent attempts by Agamben, Badiou and Žižek to rehabilitate St. Paul in the light of Nietzsche's critique in The Antichrist, and a discussion of the new movement sometimes referred to as "weak theology." Students just entering the whole field of Nietzsche scholarship will certainly be intrigued by the other chapters in this book. Indeed, Understanding Nietzscheanism is especially helpful in so far as it includes detailed discussion of several thinkers -- such as Klossowski, Kofman, Vattimo, Oliver, Ansell-Pearson, and Altizer -- who are not usually included in more general surveys of contemporary thought.

Overall, I would certainly recommend this book as a supplementary text for upper-level undergraduates and graduate students who are still coming to grips with Nietzsche's work and influence. As the author himself makes clear, Nietzsche is the one thinker that we cannot avoid because he poses the questions that are still most relevant to contemporary life.