Understanding People: Normativity and Rationalizing Explanation

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Alan Millar, Understanding People: Normativity and Rationalizing Explanation, Oxford University Press, 2004, 280pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199254400.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, King's College, Cambridge University


There is an influential view of the human mind according to which the way we understand people is radically different from the way we understand the rest of nature. One popular metaphor frequently used to articulate this view is that of a 'logical space of reasons', inhabited by thinking subjects who are both subject to, and able to reflectively appreciate, normative constraints that classify thoughts and actions as reasonable or unreasonable in various ways. On this view, personal understanding is essentially normative in a way that empirical understanding of the rest of nature is not. It is therefore impossible to conceive of a fully naturalised science of the human mind insofar as the human mind is understood as the mind of a fully developed person. It is a view of this kind that Alan Millar defends in this book. Millar's argument draws upon a wide range of recent work in philosophy of mind, epistemology and moral philosophy. It is one of the virtues of the book that it brings together a number of related questions from different areas of philosophy that the academic division of labour increasingly forces professional philosophers to address in artificial (and often unhappy) isolation.

The metaphor of a logical space of reasons can be traced back to Wilfrid Sellars's seminal 1956 paper 'Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind', but has more recently come to be associated with the work of Robert Brandom and John McDowell. Elsewhere, the claim that certain aspects of personal understanding are essentially normative has been defended by Donald Davidson in the context of his argument that the attribution of propositional attitudes like belief and desire is constrained by the assumption that people are rational believers of the true and lovers of the good. Millar situates his book in this 'long and honourable' tradition of philosophical argument, in particular in the strand of that tradition distinguished by the anti-scientism and explanatory modesty associated with Brandom and McDowell's work. Its main distinctive virtue as such is the patient and meticulous attention shown by Millar in his exploration of the details and complexities of this well-trodden territory.

At the end of Chapter 7, Millar sums up the main thrust of the preceding arguments as follows:

(a) Personal understanding has a distinct subject-matter -- it engages with people who are subject to ideals of reason and therefore incur certain commitments.

(b) Personal understanding is distinctive, qua understanding, from (natural) scientific understanding because it accords an explanatory role to normative considerations (212).

Central to the claim contained in (a) is the idea of a normative commitment. By incurring such commitments, agents make it the case that they have reasons to do or think some things rather than others. There is a variety of ways in which agents can incur normative commitments. One relatively uncontroversial way is to make a promise, thereby normatively committing oneself to either carry out the promise or take steps to be released from it. According to Millar, participation in the social practice of promising makes you subject to its governing rules, thereby also making it the case that you have a reason (not necessarily overriding) to keep your promises. The same conclusion is meant to follow for other forms of rule-governed practices, such as the filling of mutually recognised social roles and professional offices.

According to Millar, a second and distinct way of incurring a normative commitment is to form a propositional attitude like a belief or intention. This way of incurring a normative commitment is more controversial because it is obviously not a matter of voluntary participation in a social practice like an act of promising. If you incur a normative commitment by forming the belief that Tangiers is to the west of Gibraltar, you will not normally do so by way of making a voluntary decision. Yet Millar argues that the formation of belief still implies the incurring of a commitment because the attribution of propositional attitudes is constitutively governed by normative ideals of rationality. There is no way to understand the idea of belief in the absence of the attribution to persons of normative ideals. The most basic normative ideal governing belief is what Millar calls the Implication Ideal. This ideal 'provides a reason to avoid believing P while giving verdict to any implication of P other than belief' (92). The corresponding ideal for intention is what Millar calls the Means-End Ideal. This ideal 'provides a reason to avoid retaining an intention while never getting around to doing whatever is necessary if one is to do the thing intended' (92). Both the implication ideal and the means-end ideal are conditional requirements of reason in the sense that they allow for two forms of compliance: you should either follow through the relevant (theoretical or practical) implications carried by the mental state in question, or you should abandon the state altogether. What is unconditionally ruled out by both ideals is remaining in the relevant mental state while failing to follow through its (theoretical or practical) implications. To do so would be to think or act contrary to reason.

Both the implication and the means-end ideal have the conditional logical form of what, following recent work by John Broome, has come to be known as 'normative requirements'. While there is room for dispute about how exactly such requirements are to be interpreted (it is not obviously unreasonable to give a verdict other than belief to just any implication of one's beliefs, however non-obvious) and how they relate to claims about reasons (Millar thinks normative commitments entail the existence of reasons, others do not), the crucial point is that the absence of such constraints on the attribution of propositional attitudes makes it impossible to make sense of the idea that human beings are rational agents who think and do things for reasons. A creature showing no tendency to either recognise or comply with either of these normative ideals would not be truly describable as having either beliefs or intentions, and so would not be a fully developed person. The main discussion of normative commitments and their place in propositional attitude ascriptions can be found in Chapters 2-6 of the book. Millar's discussion of the normativity of propositional attitude ascription will be of interest to contemporary philosophers who are worried about the nature and possibility of meaning, concepts, and intentional content.

Central to the claim contained in (b) is the idea that normative considerations have explanatory significance. Normative considerations are claims about what it makes sense to think or do. They entail claims about what there is reason to think or do. Millar argues that the personal understanding provided by rationalising explanations of thought and action makes essential and primary use of normative considerations. To understand people it is not enough to describe them as instantiating naturalistically describable dispositional and behavioural patterns that somehow happen to satisfy the implication and means-end ideal. Nor is it enough to describe them as having attitudes with normative contents to the effect that there are reasons to think or do some things rather than others. At least in a range of favourable cases, persons can only be understood as such by taking them to be aware of the fact that there is reason to think and do some things rather than others. According to Millar, this fact of normative awareness shows that in this range of favourable cases normative considerations themselves form a non-eliminable part of intentional explanation. In these cases, people believe they have reasons to think and do certain things precisely because they do have reasons to think and do certain things (23-4). Making a move in some ways parallel to one made by Davidson in the context of his extension of the principle of charity to the domain of value, Millar illustrates his argument for the explanatory relevance of normative considerations by means of an analogy with the case of perceptual experience (208-10). Millar claims that just as it is only because we have a fairly reliable way of making perceptual discriminations between objects in our physical environment that we can truly be said to form mistaken beliefs about the perceivable properties of those objects, it is only because we have a fairly reliable way of making normative discriminations between reason-giving relations that we can truly be said to form mistaken beliefs about such relations. Thus, even if persons frequently believe themselves to have reasons when they do not, the very act of attributing this mistaken belief itself presupposes that the persons in question are also capable of believing themselves to have reasons when they really do. It follows that where there are persons there are also reasons, and consequently a distinctively normative subject-matter that, according to Millar, goes beyond the domain of the forces, processes, and regularities described by the natural sciences as normally conceived (24). The main discussion of explanatory relevance takes place in Chapters 7-8 of the book. This discussion will be of interest to contemporary philosophers who are worried about the epistemology and metaphysics of reason and value, and also to those who worry about how it is possible to act for reasons, not only in favourable cases where the reasons actually obtain, but also in unfavourable cases, like those including false belief.

Having been given a robust defence of the logical space of reasons in the course of the first 200 pages of the book, the reader might have expected Millar to conclude by trumpeting the explanatory powers of so-called common-sense psychology in the face of the imperialist ambitions of scientism and its associated worship of what McDowell has labelled 'disenchanted nature'. In fact, Millar does no such thing. Instead, in a revealing and interesting final chapter, Millar defends the much more modest view that the explanatory potential of common-sense psychology, even if genuine, is strictly limited. While rejecting the eliminativist position of Churchland and others on the grounds that it falsely assumes that the explanatory power of intentional states would have to be 'closely mirrored' by the causal powers of physical realising states, Millar accepts that common-sense psychology is unable to explain a wide range of recognisably mental phenomena. These include the representational activities of non-human animals and human infants, the nature and dynamics of mental illness, the faculty of creative imagination, the ground of intelligence differences between individuals, the nature and functions of sleep, the ability to catch a ball on the run, and the variety of perceptual illusions (231). Apart from delegating such issues to what he calls 'the interface between physiology and thought' (240), Millar also argues that common-sense psychology has a strictly limited explanatory scope even in its 'own proper' domain, excluding the explanation of such phenomena as why a subject forms a belief or performs an action at some particular time, or why an agent comes to favour some reasonable course of action over others. The result is a comparatively sceptical view both about the predictive power and about the explanatory depth of personal understanding. By the end of the book, Millar therefore ends up explicitly distancing himself from the more optimistic view of the nature and scope of common-sense psychology associated with the work of Jerry Fodor and others.

Large parts of Millar's book are taken up criticising various forms of reductive naturalism about meaning, intentional content, normativity, and rationality itself. The case for a normative account of personal understanding is partly meant to rest on the explanatorily impoverished nature of the naturalist alternatives. Space does not permit a detailed discussion of these arguments here. In the most general terms, however, philosophers of a naturalist inclination are unlikely to feel irresistibly attracted to any attempt to pile a metaphysics of normative reasons on top of a metaphysics of intentional states against the background of Millar's modest claims on behalf of common-sense psychology. From a naturalist perspective, reliable perceptual discriminations of causally efficacious natural properties do not look sufficiently analogous to reliable rational discriminations of normatively efficacious reason-giving relations to even begin to illuminate how the latter are either possible or necessary for the existence of human thought and action. Consider turning the allegedly analogous implications on their head. In the perceptual case we then get the claim that if there are no objectively existing natural properties for human beings to grasp in perception, there can be no corresponding intentional states, and therefore no perceivers. In the normative case, we get the claim that if there are no objectively existing normative reasons or values for human beings to grasp in judgement, there are no intentional states, and therefore no persons. Many naturalists will find this latter claim too good to be true. Yet it is exactly this kind of claim that Millar appears to commit himself to when he claims that personal understanding is essentially normative in the way suggested by (a) and (b) above. It might well be attractive to contemplate such an argument against the background of a picture of personal understanding as explanatorily deep and predictively powerful. Yet having rejected such an optimistic picture of common-sense psychology, Millar is left arguing instead for the indispensably normative character of personal understanding against the background of a picture of common-sense psychology as relatively patchy and superficial. Few naturalist sceptics about the conceptual and metaphysical autonomy of the logical space of reasons are likely to consider this a lethal blow to their imperialist ambitions.

Of course, if we start off by defining the logical space of reasons as conceptually autonomous from the natural domain of causes in which it is somehow supposed to be realised, it is hardly surprising if it then turns out that the sciences designed to describe the natural space of causes in some ways fail to adequately capture on exactly their own terms the normative goings on of the normative domain of personal understanding. Yet the conceptual autonomy so gained does not itself licence an inference from the (limited) explanatory usefulness of the normative concepts involved in personal understanding to the claim that the phenomena so described cannot even in principle be understood as genuinely mental phenomena in other, broadly naturalistic, terms. It may be well be true (and arguably is) that for better or worse we are stuck with our essentially normative way of thinking about human thought and action. It does not follow that no alternative conceptual framework based on our place in nature could possibly be found to allow us to think as usefully (or even more so) about the same subject-matter otherwise conceived. It is not as if the discovery of such an alternative framework would either entail or justify a blanket prohibition on the familiar common-sense vocabulary we all know and love, forbidding our commitment to the implication ideal and the means-end ideal as some kind of metaphysical superstition. If we all woke up tomorrow to the headline that the explanatory power (such as it is) of common-sense psychology had finally been surpassed by an amazing development in cognitive psychology, it is just possible that for must of us life would continue pretty much as before, only now with a wider choice of vocabularies; each potentially more useful than the other for various different purposes. Millar, it seems, would have to disagree. Drop the normative vocabulary, and you change the subject-matter completely. For Millar, the scenario just described is no more than a philosopher's fantasy.

Fantasy or not, many naturalists will remain unconvinced that Millar's argument about the nature and scope of common-sense psychology supports the view that personal understanding provides us with a uniquely insightful form of access to the human mind, and that this is the only way in principle to fully understand it. These naturalists will take Millar's argument to support the weaker claim that personal understanding provides us with one possible and essentially partial form of access to the human mind, and that we currently do not have a way to fully understand it. In the minds of these naturalists, to attribute our present ignorance to an a priori necessity as opposed to an agnostic 'we know not what' is as dogmatic as the denial that the vocabulary of common-sense psychology can play any explanatory role at all in personal understanding because human beings are merely parts of disenchanted nature.

My suspicion is that we should be less happy to rest with the claims of common-sense psychology to rule the roost of personal understanding than Millar's book suggests. Even so, in his treatment of this, as in his treatment of all the topics addressed in the book, Millar's approach is professional, scholarly, and judicious. The book also includes detailed and subtle treatments of a number of issues I have not addressed here, including the nature of normativity in general, the reflexive character of belief and intention, and the theory versus simulation debate in the philosophy of mind. The final sentence on the dust jacket gives a fair evaluation of the book's contents when it says that Understanding People will be of great interest to most philosophers of mind, as well as to those working on practical and theoretical reasoning.