Understanding Perspectivism: Scientific Challenges and Methodological Prospects

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Michela Massimi and Casey D. McCoy (eds.), Understanding Perspectivism: Scientific Challenges and Methodological Prospects, Routledge, 2019, 200pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138503069.

Reviewed by Lucas J. Matthews, Columbia University/The Hastings Center


At this point it's entirely uncontroversial that science comprises a variety of different approaches, methods, models, explanations, technologies, and perspectives. I might go so far as to say that most science is pluralistic, through and through. Complex phenomena abound in the universe, so it shouldn't be a surprise that scientific perspectives abound too. Perhaps just slightly more controversial, however, is the case when there are many different scientific perspectives on the same phenomenon. The human brain, for example, is modeled and investigated with a troop of different approaches from numerous scientific disciplines from computational neuroscience to neurobiology, and plenty in between. Given that the brain is -- arguably -- one of the most complex systems in the universe, spanning many levels of analysis, this sort of pluralism shouldn't generate too much philosophical controversy.

The application of multiple approaches to the same phenomenon, however, gets drastically more complicated in the presence of incompatibilities or incommensurabilities. The best-known examples include Kuhnian paradigms: it can't be the case that both geocentrism and heliocentrism are true characterizations of our solar system. Something's got to go. Broadly construed, Michela Massimi and Casey D. McCoy's book is about just that sort of scientific controversy: it's an impressive collection of essays providing careful answers to questions about how to make sense of multiple, sometimes conflicting, perspectives in science. Ten chapters from outstanding scholars address a slew of implications of scientific perspectivism for classic positions in philosophy of science, primarily scientific realism, pluralism, and pragmatism.

Evaluating the book calls for a touch of background. Ronald Giere (2006) proposed 'perspectivism' (also, 'perspectivalism') as a middle ground between two metaphysical extremes in the face of conflicting scientific perspectives on the same phenomenon. On the one hand, perspectival conflict could imply some strain of scientific relativism. It could simply be that different perspectives exist because each is in some way predictively or explanatorily useful, but not necessarily indicative of underlying truths or genuine scientific knowledge. On the other hand, realists might argue that something has got to go; that conflicting perspectives means that a correct model or theory ought to supplant the incorrect one. Perspectivism is Giere's middle-ground position that limns science as comprising partial, historically-situated perspectives that successfully latch on to underlying truths about the world. Massimi and McCoy's volume should be treated as a case-by-case evaluation of the implications of perspectivism for traditional debates in the philosophy of science.

With this background in mind, the contributors offer a range of interesting strategies and approaches to dealing with the case of perspectivism in science. Massimi and McCoy do a nice job organizing the essays thematically into three groups: perspectivism as it relates to pragmatism, realism, and pluralism. I'll try to give a general overview of what the contributors have to say about these three themes, starting with pragmatism. In Hasok Chang's "Pragmatism, Perspectivism, and the Historicity of Science", we learn about two major, related commonalities between perspectivism and pragmatism. The first is the 'humanist impulse' that the acquisition of scientific knowledge is part and parcel of human activity. There is no scientific knowledge without human agents engaged in some set of historically situated practices. The implication of the shared humanist impulse is that both pragmatism and perspectivism emphasize the historicity of science. Scientists as human agents develop perspectives on phenomena that are contextualized in various disciplines and time-periods. This is not to say that scientific knowledge is relative or constructed, but at the very least that it is not "a body of knowledge that comes from accessing information about nature that exists completely apart from ourselves and our investigations" (p. 11).

The remaining chapters are about how to reconcile scientific realism with the problem of multiple incompatible perspectives. Considered as a whole, the chapters are characterized by three general strategies for remaining realist in the face of scientific conflict. The first strategy is to seek to advanced understanding of what actually constitutes perspectival conflict. In "Explanation, Interdisciplinarity, and Perspectives", Melinda Bonnie Fagan, for example, develops a useful conceptual framework for diagnosing relationships between models from different perspectives. Her taxonomy of relationships include overlap, conflict, subsumption, simple additivity, cross-perspective assessment, contrast, and complementarity. There's a lot to be said about these various relationships, but here I'll focus briefly on two particularly helpful characterizations of complementarity she outlines.

Fagan argues that there are cases in which conflict between perspectives is actually useful. Negative 'N-complementarity' captures cases in which a model's representation of one aspect of a system necessarily occludes representation of another. For example, a black and white representation of a colorful object highlights contrast at the cost of color. In effect, a color-rich representation and a black-and-white representation of the same object are in direct conflict, yet complimentary, as the both offer mutually exclusive perspectives of the same phenomenon. Conversely, lock and key 'LK-complementarity' captures instances in which two models represent non-overlapping aspects of the same phenomenon -- think of two models of an engine, one of which represents electrical systems exclusively (electronic fuel injection, for example), the other of which represents mechanical systems only (pistons and rods, for example). In conjunction with the additional model relationships mentioned above, Fagan's taxonomy presents a valuable framework that can be used by other researchers to make sense of conflicting perspectives in their respective fields.

The application of Fagan's diagnostic framework to a new case is exactly what Anya Plutynski does in "Cancer Modeling: The Advantages and Limitations of Multiple Perspectives". Broadly construed, Plutynksi's move is to take an example of seemingly compatible perspectives (in cancer research) and demonstrate how they are complimentary. The move is characteristic of the second of three general strategies the contributors use to deal with cases of conflicting models: take a deflationary approach to perspectival conflict.

Plutynski challenges the predominant view that alternative models of carcinogenesis are in conflict. Although the 'oncogene paradigm' has dominated decades of cancer research, recent alternative approaches investigate cancer initiation and progression, the role of stem cells, cellular metabolism, and tissue microenvironment. Because each kind of research focuses on different causal pathways, they are interpreted as conflicting with the oncogene paradigm, which attributes causes of carcinogenesis to specific genetic mutations. On Plutynski's view, however, these are not incommensurable perspectives of cancer, they are "research programs focused on simply different causal pathways, all of which are indeed relevant to cancer, and they can be integrated into a more comprehensive view of cancer's origins" (p. 166). In "Perspectives, Representation, and Integration", Sandra D. Mitchell adopts a similar strategy, expounding the explanatory benefits of the perspectival nature of representation. Working from the case of protein folding in biology, she pushes the view that perspectivism means that the integration of multiple perspectives has epistemic value in virtue of the notion that scientists must use "integrative strategies for managing a plurality of models of a single phenomenon" (p. 179). Multiple seemingly incompatible perspectives enhance, rather than inhibit, explanatory understanding of protein folding.

A third general strategy for dealing with the case of (seemingly) incompatible perspectives is to bite the bullet and demonstrate that genuine incommensurabilities are still compatible with scientific realism. Juha Saatsi's "Realism and Explanatory Perspectives", for example, offers an enlightening account of a long history of efforts to explain rainbows, from Descartes to Netwon and Fresnel. While, indeed, older scientific explanations of rainbows came with the baggage of whacky metaphysics (such as Descartes' notion that color occurs when light spins ether particles) each historical iteration advanced understanding, getting a few things right along the way, which were built upon and advanced with ensuing perspectives. Saatsi's take is original in that he calls us to think about perspectivism in terms of explanatory understanding, as opposed to scientific knowledge. The philosophical upshot is that multiple incompatible scientific perspectives of how to explain the rainbow are compatible with realism.

With a bit of content aside, let's talk about the strengths and weaknesses of the volume, starting with the bad. Like any edited volume that I've read cover to cover: it's a mixed bag. At worst, a few chapters are vague or overwrought -- sometimes both. Others are dissatisfyingly devoid of scientific case studies. Still others read like hastily-written rehashings of old, previously published views. "Frozen lunches", as one of my graduate school mentors used to call them. I'll complain as well that there's too little tension between views within the volume. All the authors endorse a view of perspectivism that is compatible with some strain of scientific realism -- there are no explicit anti-realists. And although I too am a realist, it would have been nice to see representation from the relativists in an edited volume on perspectivism in science. Moreover, everyone seems to agree that perspectivism is in some way helpful to pluralism -- it provides a toolset that can explain, for example, why a plurality of perspectives is explanatorily advantageous. Again, though, it would have been nice to have a dissenting chapter or two in which philosophers of science push back against the notion that perspectivism makes a valuable contribution to ongoing discussion of pluralism.

The good news is that, overall, it's a high-quality edited volume. And although there may be a few uninspiring chapters, a vast majority are thorough, informative, and stimulating -- while a few are exceptional and refreshing. I chose to consider Fagan's and Plutynski's essays because they are easily two of the best chapters -- definitely worth reading closely. Another standout is David Danks' "Safe-and-Substantive Perspectivism" which presents a view refreshingly unique from all other chapters. While most contributors writing about realism take the issue at face value, as it has been presented in previous work, Danks does what philosophers do best and takes a step back, thinking about perspectivism from a broader perspective. He works to dig in to just where and how perspectives enter into science and draws a useful distinction between two extremes: 'unsafe' hyperlocal perspectivism and 'insubstantial' high-level perspectivism. The former refers to the notion that perspectives set the basis for science at the level of individual scientists, which may be "dependent on local, contingent properties of specific people" (p. 127). The latter refers an opposite notion that scientific perspectives are highly abstract and general human activities -- a notion that Danks deems uninformative regarding the nature of scientific perspectives.

To that end, Danks offers an alternative that construes science as necessarily and unproblematically perspectival. Here the big picture is that perspectives aren't unique to science, and consequently aren't any more of a problem for science than they are for any other domain where there are multiple, often incompatible perspectives, such as general human perception:

More precisely, these sources of perspectivism are not unique to scientific theories, knowledge, and beliefs but rather apply to their everyday counterparts. That is, there is nothing special (with respect to these arguments) about science, and so the resulting perspectivism about science does not threaten a collapse into complete relativism (or at least, poses no more threat than we face about all of our beliefs and knowledge). (p. 128)

It strikes me as an insightful move to step away from trenchant debate about realism in science by posing a more fundamental question: does the presence of multiple perspectives pose a problem for realism simpliciter?

Another prominent strength of the book is that it is teeming with a wide array of detailed scientific case studies. Contributors with expertise in many different backgrounds flesh out explanations and models of rainbows, protein folding, carcinogenesis, measurement theory, mass of the electron, color perception, tidal phenomena, multi-level cellular behavior and nuclei, and the motor cortex. Each case considered provides analysis of how sundry scientific phenomena are explained and modeled from two or more perspectives, elucidating a stimulatingly diverse view of scientific investigation as whole.

Perhaps the book's greatest strength is that it paves the way for plenty of future work. The contributors demonstrate, perhaps unsurprisingly, that different scientific cases from different disciplines provoke different implications for perspectivism. For example, while Plutynski's analysis of cancer research reveals that seemingly conflicting models can be shown to be complimentary, Saatsi's account of physical descriptions of rainbows reveals genuine incompatibilities between competing and incommensurable scientific perspectives of the very same phenomenon. This motivates additional philosophical perspectives from philosophers of science who work on areas not considered in this volume, such as philosophy of statistics, chemistry, earth sciences, psychology, psychiatry, economics, and social science. Surely we should expect a variety of new and interesting cases of perspectival conflicts with juicy implications for philosophy of science. Professionals and graduate students would benefit from reading the book, as it should inspire ideas for philosophical questions to be addressed about their own areas of expertise, as it did mine.


Giere, Ronald N. 2006. Scientific Perspectivism. University of Chicago Press.