Understanding Phenomenal Consciousness

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William Robinson, Understanding Phenomenal Consciousness, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 276pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521834635.

Reviewed by Maja Spener, University College, London


In his book Understanding Phenomenal Consciousness William Robinson sets out to give an account of conscious experience. According to him, an adequate account of this phenomenon needs to embrace a form of epiphenomenalist dualism, a view he calls ‘Qualitative Event Realism’ (QER). This is the view that phenomenal experiences are immaterial events constituted by non-relational, intrinsic phenomenal qualities and caused by neural events in the brain.

There are two prongs to Robinson’s strategy: one is to demonstrate that his dualist view is better placed than its materialist rivals to give a substantial account of conscious experience. The other is to make clear that acceptance of dualism does not come at the cost of giving up a scientific approach to the mind. Indeed, throughout the book Robinson seeks to redress the balance between materialism and dualism concerning respect for science and scientific methodology. He repeatedly argues that a healthy regard for science should motivate preference for dualism over materialism.

The book comes in two parts. The first, longer one (chapters 1-10) is a sustained argument for QER. Robinson proceeds by attacking various rival accounts of experience while continuously motivating QER. The views on consciousness he critiques are representationalism, higher-order-thought and monitoring theories and functionalism. Robinson then takes himself to be in the following position: if there is a genuine phenomenon of conscious experience, materialist views cannot account for it satisfactorily and we are better off accepting dualism (in particular, QER). He then rightly recognises that a materialist might simply deny the phenomenon itself and so he attacks eliminativism about phenomenal consciousness. Having done so, Robinson shores up support for his view by responding to various materialist objections to the epiphenomenalist aspect of QER.

The second, shorter part (chapters 11-13) investigates the future possibilities QER offers for a scientific explanation of consciousness. Robinson explores the prospects of a theory ‘in which qualitative events will be regarded as being as fundamentally real as quarks or quasars, and in which we will have a satisfying explanatory understanding of the relations among all of the things we regard as real’ (184). He calls such an overall theory a ‘unified dualism’. Robinson’s views here are mainly speculative and his aim is to sketch the exciting direction in which he thinks QER will take us.

Robinson’s book is nicely structured and well organised. It is also packed with arguments and discussions of a wide range of views, all fitted neatly into an overall narrative. I found much to engage with and learned plenty from doing so. In this review, I will concentrate on the first part of the book. Specifically, I am interested in Robinson’s starting assumptions about phenomenal experience and the role these play in his debate with the materialist.

Robinson has the following intuition about phenomenal experiences, or as he sometimes calls them, ‘appearances’: when it comes to appearances, they are what they seem (to the person having them) and nothing else. The idea is, I take it, that the nature of appearances is evident to first-person reflection on them. While not entirely uncontroversial as it stands, its precise bite depends, of course, on what appearances seem to be upon first-person reflection. In Robinson’s case, he stipulates that when something appears red to me, red is an appearance-constituting property. Further, and importantly, he assumes that appearances have the properties by which they are constituted. That is, the appearance-constituting property red is a property of experience itself, a so called ‘phenomenal quality’. In this way, Robinson regards paradigm observable properties such as colours and shapes as phenomenal qualities. When something appears red to me, then, given Robinson’s assumption, one can speak of my appearance being red. I will discuss this conception of phenomenal experience below. For now, consider Robinson’s intuition in the light of the above stipulation and assumption about the properties of appearances: appearances have the properties by which they are constituted and none other (save trivial ones concerning time and place of occurrence, etc).

With the help of his intuition, Robinson says we can give an argument for dualism about appearances. Briefly, suppose I have an appearance constituted by red (i.e. suppose something appears red to me). In such a case, I do not have an appearance constituted by a material property (i.e. nothing appears to be a neural event, state, or such-like to me). Therefore, given Robinson’s intuition, my appearance is not material.

Robinson readily admits that not everyone will share his intuition. In particular, he thinks materialists will reject it and insist that phenomenal qualities are identical to material properties, whether or not this seems to be so in having experience. So Robinson concedes that this argument is not going to make a persuasive case for dualism. Yet, he says, we can already draw a moral at this point: materialism based on rejecting his intuition about appearances is ‘an empty view that provides no enlightenment’ (42). (I suppose he thinks that materialism involving the claim that appearances seem material is just too implausible.) Materialism is empty on Robinson’s view because it contains no explanation of how an appearance property could be identical to a material property or how appearances could have a ‘hidden nature’. An explanatory reduction of phenomenal qualities to physical properties which would allow us to derive the former from the latter does not seem possible — there seems to be an unbridgeable gap between the phenomenal and the physical. Non-reductive materialists, of course, try to explain the impossibility of explanatory reduction between phenomenal qualities and physical properties without giving up the identity claim. Their explanation turns on the idea that we have distinct ways to think about the same property, which involve the application of very different and independent concepts. On their view, it is the distinctness of the concepts that explains the impossibility of an explanatory reduction, not a distinctness of properties. Robinson insists this proposal is empty, too: ‘it does not explain how it is possible that the same property could appear as what it is (namely, red or pain) when it is being had, and yet not appear as what it equally is (namely, a neural event property) when it is being had’ (48).

Importantly, Robinson’s complaint here against materialism is not that materialism is false, but that it is empty. He aims to reveal an asymmetry between dualism and materialism. Dualism, he says, has an explanation of the seeming difference between material and phenomenal properties — they are different properties. Materialism, by contrast, says they are the same but has no explanation of how this could be so or how a neural property could fail to appear as it is. According to Robinson, dualism is the more substantive account because it provides an explanation where an explanation is needed. And, he argues, materialism is uncomfortably silent about these explanatory needs.

This charge of emptiness is Robinson’s core criticism of materialism. But I think a materialist might respond by reasonably rejecting Robinson’s specific demands for explanation. For one thing, a materialist might point out that identities are fundamental. One will look in vain for a story to tell about why an informative identity statement is true. Of course, an identity must have some explanatory pay-off to earn its keep, but importantly this does not include an explanation of the identity itself. Also, a materialist would most likely reject the idea that any such explanatory pay-off will have to be obvious from first-person reflection on experience. Specifically, she would resist the demand that it includes an explanation of how it could be that the alleged physical nature of phenomenal experience is not apparent in having the experience. What these responses show is that Robinson’s dualist position vis-ˆ-vis materialism is better characterised as a stand-off involving different intuitions about appearances and the explanatory tasks of a theory of phenomenal experience. It is not, as he himself would like to have it, a dialectically advantageous position that reveals dualism already to be the more satisfactory view.

To be fair, Robinson holds that a fully persuasive case for dualism must proceed indirectly by showing in detail that its materialist rivals are ill suited to give an adequate account of phenomenal experience. So, the chief part of the book is devoted to discussing and rejecting various materialist accounts of consciousness. This turns our focus to Robinson’s conception of phenomenal experience. For if the issue between dualism and materialism turns on who can best account for phenomenal experience, we should presumably start with a relatively uncontroversial characterisation of the phenomenon.

Robinson introduces the notion of phenomenal qualities when motivating the question his book aims to answer — ‘How do phenomenal qualities come into a full accounting of what happens when a person is having a perceptual experience or sensation?’(8) He says that phenomenal qualities ‘enter in some way into perceptual situations, bodily sensations, emotions, and imagery’ (11) and they are what other people mean by qualia. Robinson approvingly quotes C. I. Lewis, who says that qualia are ‘the recognisable characters of the given’ that nonetheless ‘must be distinguished from properties of objects’ (fn 3/11). So far this is pretty innocuous. Phenomenal qualities are properties of experience, not of ordinary objects. But he further says that examples of phenomenal qualities are ‘colours, pitches, tastes, smells, degrees of pressure and warmth, shapes (e.g. of afterimages or apples), pain qualities, itches, sexual pleasantness, nausea and other qualities like these’ (8). Now this is quite a list. To hold that these properties are all examples of phenomenal qualities is a controversial claim and certainly surprising as a starting assumption.

How does Robinson come to make it? He motivates his concerns about phenomenal consciousness by considering after-images. When one has an after-image as of some green shape, there appears to be something green when there patently is no such thing literally before one or in the brain. In order to adequately describe the experience, one needs to mention green — but, Robinson asks, how does green come into it without any candidate properties in the perceptual circumstances? He now turns to the properties of the experience itself to account for greenness and considers properties of the brain, such as neural activations. But ‘neural activations … are not something of which we are ordinarily conscious… . If we confine ourselves to the neuroscience of how afterimages are produced, we will never have any reason to use color words’ (4).

Robinson insists that his question can be asked about perceptually successful experience, too. In ordinary perception — e.g. seeing a red apple — we can tell a story involving light wavelengths, surface properties such as reflectance profiles, retinal cells, neural cells, etc. ‘Nowhere in this list do we find red or any other color. But Eve sees red. The apple she sees is red, and if conditions are normal, it looks red to her. How or where, we may ask, does Eve’s experience of red come into our account at all? How or where does red enter the perceptual situation in this story?’ (8)

In my view, several different issues about experience are raised here at once. One is that typically we will not find a candidate property in the perceptual environment if the experience in question is an after-image or a hallucination. This is a worry about how non-veridical experiences come to present us with something in the absence of whatever they seem to present. A second issue is that what it is like to experience something red cannot be adequately characterised in terms of some neural property. So we cannot account for the phenomenal character of our experience of red in terms of neural properties. This is a worry about reconciling the phenomenal qualities of experience with a scientific description of, say, the brain. A third issue is that even when it comes to veridical experiences of red we cannot find a candidate property in the perceptual environment to account for it because the micro-physical properties of the environment will not amount to a phenomenologically adequate characterisation of the content of our experience. This is a worry about reconciling the manifest image of observed properties in the world with a (micro-level) scientific description of it.

These are distinct worries that ought to be tackled separately. To be sure, doing so makes them more tractable. For instance, we could resolve the third issue by rejecting the choice of a micro-level description of the world. Instead we account for the content of experience on the basis of a common-sense description of the world. This way, there is an excellent candidate property possessed by the apple itself in terms of which we can account for the experience of the red apple. The apple is red, in its rich and homogeneous glory, and this is what Eve’s experience is about. With this candidate property at hand, we could then give a representational account of experience that will solve our problem of after-images and other non-veridical experiences. Experience, on such a view, is a kind of representation and one can represent things in their absence. Further, we account for what it is like to undergo an experience of something red — for the phenomenal character of the experience — by appeal to its representational content. In particular, we might say that the red-related phenomenal properties of the experience are adequately specified in terms of the representational property individuated by reference to the redness of apples in the world. Now, this view of experience will not appeal to everyone and worries could be raised at different junctures. The point I am making is just that when considered separately, the issues about experience Robinson raises do not automatically support the assumption that colours and other qualities are phenomenal qualities, i.e. properties of the experience, rather than of ordinary objects.

There is a deeper concern here. Suppose we were to follow Robinson in his choice of a micro-physical description of the physical environment. In such a case one could, say, opt for a sense-datum account of experience and hold that in experience we are acquainted with a special kind of object that has special sensory properties. These special properties would still not be phenomenal properties, but they would figure in an account of the latter. So, although an account of the content of experience must be phenomenologically adequate — that is, it should not distort what it is like to have the experience — this does not mean that the properties in service of such an account are phenomenal properties. One should distinguish different levels, namely the level of what experience is about and the level of the phenomenal character of experience itself. On Robinson’s conception of phenomenal qualities this distinction between levels in an account of experience is not genuinely available. Red-related properties in the world (P-red properties as he call them), such as certain reflectance profiles, are had by ordinary objects and they cause experiences of red but they never enter in any specification of experience itself. The latter is done entirely in terms of the phenomenal quality and so must include both what experience is like and what experience is about.

Robinson’s own positive view, QER, confirms this lack of distinction: experience is an event constituted by immaterial qualities, such as colours, shapes, etc. Ordinary objects are said to have physical properties that typically cause phenomenally qualitied events but they are distinct properties. On this view, an apple, say, appears red to me insofar as its properties cause my (literally) red experience. Although unusual, given his initial conception of matters phenomenal, this may well be the best account of the phenomenological data. But then I anticipate that many of his materialist opponents will shift the debate to one about the acceptable starting assumptions about the phenomenon in question: what are the phenomenological data that we have to account for?

The main focus of such a debate will likely be the appeal to the transparency of experience, usually made by representationalists about experience. Briefly, it starts with the phenomenological claim that when one attends to what one’s experience is like, one is only aware of what the experience is about, namely ordinary mind-independent objects and their properties. One looks through an experience to what it is an experience about. It is then concluded that there is no good reason to postulate sense data or intrinsic properties of experience since there is no introspective evidence for them. Moreover, as we are only aware of what experience is about (i.e. the world) — something we can account for in representational terms — we have a positive reason to adopt representationalism about phenomenal character.

Robinson deals with the appeal to transparency in chapter 5. His main response to it is to point out that QER agrees with the crucial phenomenological fact at work in the argument. The trouble, according to him, is that this fact has been ‘misconstrued (misdescribed, mistheorised)’ (74) by representationalists. Once this is straightened out, he says, there remains no threat to QER. For what the representationalist thinks of as looking through experience to what experience is about, is, on his view, more aptly described as the three-dimensionality of visual experience itself. And, according to QER, this three-dimensionality is also an immaterial intrinsic phenomenal quality of the experiential event.

While this is an interesting response to the transparency appeal, I think Robinson does not quite take in its full measure. Fans of transparency claim that when we take experience at face value, we seem to be aware of the world, i.e. of ordinary objects and their properties. One lesson we are to take home is that phenomenal character must not be conceived in isolation from what experience is about. But QER does not make room for the distinction between the level of phenomenal character and that of content. Without the level distinction, however, experiential awareness itself does not get to be about the world. If something looks red to me, I am aware of a property of my experience, not of the world. Experience as such is completely severed from the world. Making three-dimensionality an immaterial property of experience merely entrenches this problem. It does not help to add, as Robinson does, that experience represents the world in virtue of phenomenal qualities reliably being caused by, or covarying with, physical properties of ordinary objects. Such an aspect is external to the phenomenal property. Experiential awareness itself is captured in terms of intrinsic properties of experience and those are specified independently of the world. Phenomenologically, proponents of transparency will point out, this seems radically mistaken. So, resistance to QER is not grounded merely in worries about odd immaterial properties. Opponents will claim that QER does not account for the pre-theoretically available phenomenological data — it does not capture what we would intuitively recognise as phenomenal experience.

This in itself amounts to another stand-off between Robinson and his opponents, this time about the pre-theoretically available phenomenological data. In addition, though, the existence of such radical disagreement about phenomenology is problematic for Robinson’s methodological assumptions. He insists — especially in defence against eliminativism about phenomenal experience in chapter 9 — on the legitimacy of the first-person methodology in constructing a theory of experience. This methodology, he says, is subject to constraints; and one emphasised by him is widespread agreement on the introspective evidence. The latter guarantees, on his view, that the claims in question have ‘a kind of objectivity’ (147). Disagreement about phenomenology, then, is likely to introduce some tension in the overall project.

I must emphasise that although I have made much of concerns relating to Robinson’s starting assumptions about phenomenal experience, I very much enjoyed reading his book. I do think, though, that my concerns help his opponents in the sense that the debate shifts to a disagreement about the phenomenological data. This means that Robinson is in a less advantageous argumentative position than he makes out to be. But having said this, one of the virtues of the book is that Robinson takes care to consider evidence and arguments from a wide variety of sources, balancing appeals to common sense, ordinary language, empirical data as well as phenomenological data. As a whole, Robinson presents us with a stimulating and interesting treatment of conscious experience.