Understanding Phenomenology

Placeholder book cover

David R. Cerbone, Understanding Phenomenology, Acumen, 2006, 224pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 1844650553.

Reviewed by Dermot Moran, University College Dublin & Northwestern University


This book appears in a series -- Understanding Movements in Modern Thought -- that aims to provide, primarily for undergraduates, accessible and concise introductions to central philosophical themes. David Cerbone's very readable and helpful book on phenomenology certainly lives up to the series' aim. In recent years there has been an extraordinary resurgence of interest in phenomenology both in continental philosophy (with students anxious to understand the tradition which has given rise to the complex thought of Derrida, Levinas, Lacan, and others) and in analytic philosophy (where the intersection between philosophy of mind and cognitive science has stimulated interest in the first-person experience of consciousness). To assist in understanding the phenomenological movement Cerbone has contributed a very useful book that is accessible to students trained in either tradition.

Cerbone explains phenomenology as follows:

Phenomenology is precisely concerned with the way in which things show up or are manifest to us, with the shape and structure of manifestation. (Cerbone, p. 7)

Cerbone goes on to acknowledge that phenomenology as a movement is a very broad church; nevertheless, he believes that certain key aspects of its method are quite clearly discernible, and he goes on to argue for its continued relevance for addressing issues in contemporary philosophy, including issues in the philosophy of consciousness (at the end of the book he discusses Daniel Dennett, for instance).

The book begins with some 'opening exercises' to introduce the reader to the phenomenological approach (which, for Cerbone, essentially involves taking note of the subjective dimension of experience -- 'attending to experience rather than what is experienced', Cerbone, p. 3). He then takes the reader through the work of the four main phenomenologists: two German (Husserl and Heidegger), and two French (Sartre and Merleau-Ponty). In general, Cerbone presents Husserl as seeking to develop a 'pure' phenomenology of the transcendental ego that inevitably ends up as a transcendental idealism. Heidegger is portrayed as radically transforming phenomenology and moving it in a more existential direction. Heidegger is presented as the phenomenologist of everydayness, emphasising the manner in which our existence 'matters' to us in a practical sense. Sartre is presented by Cerbone as revising the phenomenological approach to the ego and its self-knowledge, as well as offering an interesting account of the experience of consciousness as a kind of 'nothingness'. Merleau-Ponty is characterised as a phenomenologist of embodiment and of embodied perception, making use of pathological malfunctions to shed light on the hidden workings of 'normal' conscious experience.

In discussing the four philosophers that form the bulk of the book, Cerbone humorously describes his method as 'the used-car salesman's approach', i.e. he extols the virtues and downplays the defects of these philosophers. In other words, Cerbone is deliberately abstaining from a more critical evaluation of these thinkers. In the final chapter, however, he tries to address their defects in a discussion of the 'problems and prospects' of phenomenology. Here Levinas and Derrida are treated as challenging phenomenology in various ways (Levinas with his emphasis on the face and the need to prioritise the other over oneself; Derrida for his deconstructive critique of presence). Daniel Dennett's critique of phenomenology as a kind of introspectionism is also discussed. Overall, however, Cerbone concludes that phenomenology remains vital to contemporary philosophy as a way of giving conscious experience, precisely in the manner in which it is experienced, its due. Phenomenology is recuperative in philosophy precisely because of the emphasis it places on the 'general validity of the category of experience' (Cerbone, p. 175).

Each chapter ends with a summary of key points, and there are helpful inserts (in text boxes) giving explanations of terms like 'noema' (p. 29), 'transcendental idealism' (p. 36), 'Husserl and the life-world' (p. 51), 'existentialism' (p. 88) as well as similar boxes on Brentano, Gelb and Goldstein, and so on. The chapters on individual philosophers begin with short biographical sketches, and there is a short annotated guide to 'further reading' at the end of the book. For reasons of full disclosure, I should mention that Cerbone refers briefly to my own Introduction to Phenomenology (2000) in the Further Reading section.

Husserl is presented as a critique of naturalism, explained by Cerbone as 'a rejection of the idea that the natural sciences can provide a complete or exhaustive account of reality' (Cerbone, p. 14). Cerbone reads Husserl's rejection of psychologism in the Logical Investigations as already a commitment to anti-naturalism. While Husserl is certainly anti-psychologistic, I believe it took him some years to realise that this anti-psychologism was actually part of a broader resistance to naturalism. But I do not think naturalism can be defined in the way Cerbone does because that definition would turn every thinker who argued for the importance of the human sciences complementing the natural sciences into an anti-naturalist. In fact, Husserl's anti-naturalism stemmed from a transcendental insight that consciousness, which is 'for the world', couldn't be fully explained in terms of the world itself.

Cerbone goes on to give a very clear and helpful account of Husserl on the nature of perception, the manner in which objects appear in profiles, and the manner in which the application of the reduction helps to isolate the given precisely as it is given. Cerbone gives a good account of Husserl's distinction between the way physical spatial objects appear in profiles and the manner in which our own conscious experiences themselves appear exactly as they are (their esse is percipi, as Husserl says). In other words, as Cerbone puts it, the is-seems distinction collapses in the case of conscious experiences (first-person perceivings, imaginings, rememberings, etc) whereas this distinction remains operative in our encounters with objects transcendent to consciousness. It is a pity Cerbone does not take a more critical stance towards Husserl's claim here. It always struck me that emotions (and other 'immanent' conscious experiences, Erlebnisse) can present themselves in profiles, despite Husserl's denial. Surely an anger experience can be later reflected on and seen to have had a certain character that it did not present at the time, or it may now be seen through a certain feeling of regret while in its earlier manifestation it adumbrated itself very differently. Husserl explicitly says 'an Erlebnis does not adumbrate itself' but he is quite clearly wrong about that. Cerbone goes on to give a very interesting account of the noema and to review Husserl's account of the ego in a helpful way. Overall, however, he presents these doctrines relatively unproblematically, whereas Husserl himself always conveys an impression of struggling deeply to clarify what he wanted to mean. Cerbone's account of Husserl is a little too neat to do justice to a very untidy thinker.

Cerbone's reading of Heidegger casts him as rejecting Husserl's subjectivism, overcoming the mind-body dualism. Cerbone correctly characterises Husserl's own disappointed reaction to Heidegger's Being and Time. In Cerbone's words, Husserl regarded it as a kind of 'puffed-up anthropology', another 'trendy' contribution to life-philosophy. This is certainly accurate. Indeed, Husserl's reaction is understandable. Anyone who reads Heidegger's lectures through the first half of the 1920s will certainly gain the impression that Heidegger was interested in a radicalised life-philosophy, one that captured the individual and personal experience of living through an actual historical life in the world. However, especially in Being and Time (and thenceforth), Heidegger prioritises the question of the meaning of Being and the unique access of human beings to the meaning of Being as his primary theme, and rejects as superficial previous life-philosophies. Cerbone clearly explains Heidegger's focus on ontology but somewhat glides over the fact that Heidegger insists that ontology is possible only as phenomenology. Cerbone correctly documents Heidegger's departures from Husserlian phenomenology, e.g. dropping the phenomenological reduction, and emphasises that what Heidegger wants to explore is Dasein's lived and largely taken-for-granted pre-understanding of its own being. Heidegger is looking for a 'phenomenology of everydayness' which Cerbone claims is directly opposed to Husserl's interest in pure phenomenology. I think the matter is far more complicated, however. Husserl begins (in Ideas I and thereafter) from the experience of life lived in the natural attitude. He recognises that the natural attitude as such is unaware of its own nature. It takes some kind of break or disruption for the inquirer to recognise that in fact the everyday world is given as such only because it is correlated with the natural attitude. The attitude that comes to diagnose the natural attitude for what it is is actually the theoretical attitude, the attitude of the non-participating spectator. Husserl is surely right to wonder precisely from what attitude Heidegger is conducting his own inquiry into everydayness. How is it possible to diagnose life lived in its everydayness without somehow disrupting that life? Cerbone does acknowledge that the description of everydayness in Being and Time Division One is largely carried out in the form of 'third-person description' (Cerbone, p. 65), but he does not pause to consider how such description is indeed possible. He simply contrasts Heidegger's practice of 'reflective self-awareness' (Cerbone, p. 66) with Husserl's. But precisely therein lies the problem. At least Husserl was deeply aware of the problem of how a self or ego can carry out a self-meditation on its own condition; he speaks of the 'splitting' or 'doubling' of the ego. Heidegger, for all his methodological fussiness, seems oblivious to the need to clarify his own mode of approach to the phenomenon of everyday Dasein.

Cerbone goes on to describe Heidegger's recognition that our primary stance towards things is not one of neutral observation, but rather one of practical engagement. I am surrounded by books, desks, lights, computers, and other apparatus, which I incorporate into my goal-oriented activities. Heidegger speaks of being directly in comportment with 'environmental things' (Umweltdinge) rather than the 'mere objects' of Husserlian direct perception. Cerbone describes this as the 'practical orientation' of Heidegger's philosophy and regards it as a major correction of the spectator-attitude of traditional Western philosophy (an attitude also exemplified by Husserl, of course). It involves Heidegger rejecting traditional substance/property ontology in favour of an ontology of practical engagements and comportments, an ontology of the 'ready-to-hand'. Cerbone then moves on to discuss Dasein's self-understanding and Heidegger's diagnosis of how each of us finds ourselves in a particular concernful state of mind (Befindlichkeit), how the experience of the I involves a certain dissipation into the everyday, worldly 'das Man' in a condition of captivation or seduction by the world which Heidegger calls 'falling' (Verfallen). All this is neatly and deftly described by Cerbone. Cerbone briefly summarises Heidegger's discussions of inauthenticity and authenticity and his characterisation of Dasein's authentic attitude towards temporality as essentially futural, whereas everydayness draws us into a more anonymous repetition of the present. Overall, the treatment of Heidegger is reliable but not necessarily adventurous and certainly uncritical.

Cerbone, however, sees Heidegger as offering a 'dramatic transformation' (Cerbone, p. 65) of Husserlian phenomenology, and portrays both Sartre and Merleau-Ponty as following on from this Heideggerian transformation, rejecting the 'pure ego' of Husserl. Cerbone is clearly indebted to the work of Hubert Dreyfus and his students (including Randall Havas, Bill Blattner, Taylor Carman, and others) who belong to what is often referred to as the 'West Coast' school of Heidegger interpretation. According to a parody of this approach, this school believes Heidegger's Being and Time is all about hammering whereas more traditional readers believe it to be about an impending crisis in Western Civilisation. Cerbone himself explains Dreyfus' approach to Heidegger (in one of the textboxes) as the conviction that 'our everyday understanding is a matter of largely non-discursive 'know how', which cannot be reconstructed as a series of propositions or representations in the mind of the agent who understands' (Cerbone, p. 48). This is often taken to be the 'pragmatic' reading of Heidegger and, naturally, this West Coast approach usually takes Heidegger's side against Husserl on matters such as the nature of consciousness and self-reflection. Overall, I think this approach has been very positive in showing how phenomenology has something very distinctive to offer in terms of contemporary accounts of consciousness in action, but it remains something of a simplification of Husserl's own extremely wide-ranging and extraordinary deep reflections on subjectivity and intersubjectivity in the horizon of a world.

Cerbone's chapter on Sartre covers the main issues of his phenomenology -- the nature of the ego, anxiety, freedom, and so on -- and does so in an admirably clear and engaging way. Missing, however, is discussion of one of Sartre's most original contributions, namely, his phenomenology of image-consciousness and imagination generally. I agree with Cerbone that Sartre's phenomenological analysis of the ego is a very interesting account of how the ego is experienced (or more accurately is not directly experienced) in everyday active contexts. There is, as Sartre puts it, the direct experience of the 'bus-to-be-caught' rather than the experience of the I in the activity of racing for a bus. Cerbone follows Sartre in characterising his account as more or less a refutation of Husserl's account of the ego. But, as is the case with Heidegger, there is always far more going on in Husserl. Indeed, Husserl too makes a clear distinction between the ego in its 'actional' role, when it is deliberately judging, deciding and so on, and the ego as it is more usually experienced as an absorbed consciousness of the experience undergone. Cerbone has Sartre saying that the transcendental ego is not directly experienced, but surely Husserl would not deny that. It takes a radical shift of perspective away from everyday consciousness to become aware of the transcendental ego which normally operates anonymously in simply presenting the world as the unified backdrop and horizon of all experience. Cerbone is, however, justly critical of Sartre's somewhat naïve belief that first-degree consciousness can always be recovered in a kind of sympathetic non-objectifying non-reflective awareness that somehow conspires along with the original experience. In the case of Sartre, Cerbone does raise the important question of how a phenomenology of reflection is supposed to return to lived experience, but surely, as we have seen, this is equally problematic for Heidegger?

Cerbone's chapter on Merleau-Ponty opens by recognising that Sartre's account of embodiment is far more nuanced than many give him credit for. One could say, in fact, that Sartre (without direct knowledge of Husserl's manuscripts on embodiment, now known as Ideas II) more or less invented a phenomenology of the body in Being and Nothingness (1943). Merleau-Ponty, however, is the philosopher who established his name as a phenomenologist of the body and who did have direct access to Husserl's manuscripts. (Strictly speaking, of course, Edith Stein had published her thesis On Empathy already in 1917, which summarised accurately and put into the public domain a Husserlian account of the body as the medium and organ of perception.[1]) Cerbone does a good job of explaining Merleau-Ponty's efforts to return to the site of pre-reflective, embodied experience, and overall gives an excellent account of Merleau-Ponty's treatment of the case of Schneider, the phenomenon of the phantom limb, and so on. He is very good on Merleau-Ponty's emphasis on the thickness of sensuous experience and the manner in which the different sensory modalities are intertwined such that I can see a flame as something that will burn and hurt me; I see the carpet as rough, and so on.

In general, I was very pleased by Cerbone's way of characterising the work of both Sartre and Merleau-Ponty. Indeed, it is hard for me to find anything major to disagree with regarding Cerbone's treatment of the individual thinkers. My main worries concern Cerbone's conception of phenomenology itself, as well as his somewhat simplistic approach to Husserl. If one takes the first chapter to be definitive, it actually presents phenomenology as a description of the subjective aspect of experience rather than a description of the inextricable correlation between subjectivity and objectivity. A lot of phenomenology is really focused on the manner in which objectivity is constituted for subjectivity rather than simply an account of the subjective dimension of experience. I believe this is an important distinction and one that Husserl frequently made. As we know, Husserl resisted equating phenomenology with phenomenological psychology. Similarly, I worry that Cerbone somewhat too quickly sides with the Heideggerian victory over Husserlian phenomenology. In one sense, it is of course true that Heidegger dealt a fatal blow to Husserlian phenomenology, in terms of its future popularity among philosophers. But one should not always accept that because history is written by the victors that that version is a true account. Much of what Heidegger has to say about practical engagement with things is already present in Husserl's discussions of the perception of things within horizons.

I think that it is important for phenomenology to once again assess the contribution of Edmund Husserl especially in the light of the extraordinary wealth of manuscripts that are now available to us thanks to the Husserliana edition. I do not think we should easily accept at face value Heideggerian or Sartrean criticisms of Husserl without first attempting to ascertain precisely where Husserl himself stood on the central, thorny issues. Overall, however, I enjoyed reading Cerbone's book and would certainly recommend it to my students as a jargon-free and generally reliable account of the central figures in phenomenology.

[1] Edith Stein, On the Problem of Empathy, trans. Waltraut Stein (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1964. Reprinted Washington, DC: ICS Publications, 1989).