Understanding Plato's Republic

Placeholder book cover

Gerasimos Santas, Understanding Plato's Republic, Wiley-Blackwell, 2010, 238pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405120180.

Reviewed by Michelle Jenkins, Whitman College


The Republic is undoubtedly one of Plato's masterworks and one of the most influential and widely read books in the history of philosophy. It is also devilishly difficult to truly understand. There are any number of reasons for this, but one of them is the sheer breadth of topics and issues that Plato introduces over the course of the dialogue. Readers must make sense not only of those issues in their own right but they must also understand them in relation to the larger themes and arguments of the work. This is, to be sure, a daunting task, particularly for readers who are approaching the dialogue for the first time. In his book, Gerasimos Santas aims to help the reader better understand the Republic by focusing on its central argument -- that we are better off just than unjust. He does this, though, through a particular methodological lens. In his preface, Santas states that the Republic is "a book that is always contemporary," and this sentiment carries through in the focus and method of his book. Santas divides his attention between offering a text-based exegesis of Plato's arguments regarding justice and critically engaging in the text in a way that is highly informed by the works of other, more contemporary, thinkers.[1] The result is a book that gives its readers some grounding in the basic threads of argument in theRepublic while also encouraging and empowering them to engage the text and see the arguments as making philosophical claims that are still relevant and worthy of our consideration today. Indeed it is this last thing -- Santas's critical engagement with the text and emphasis on getting the reader involved in its debates and arguments -- that is the real strength of this book.

While I quite appreciated that element of the book, I have reservations about the exegetical component. In particular, I worry that Santas omits any meaningful discussion of passages that are, I think, fundamental to understanding the central claims of the Republic and, consequently, of the Republic as a whole. In what follows, I will offer a brief overview of Understanding Plato's Republic and then will look at two passages where Santas's silence is most problematic, given his aim of explaining the Republic's arguments about the nature and value of justice.

Santas presents the Republic as a dialogue between three different accounts of justice. In chapter two, he describes how Thrasymachus, using an empirically-informed method, argues that justice is the interest of the rulers. In chapter three we turn to Glaucon and Adeimantus who, appealing to a contractarian method of investigation, conclude that justice emerges from an agreement between parties not to harm one another. By presenting these two theories of justice early on, Santas gives readers alternatives to consider alongside Socrates's own accounts and recommendations.

While each of these alternatives are given chapter-long treatments, Santas's central focus is, unsurprisingly, on Plato's own accounts and defense of justice. Following the structure of the Republic, he first looks at the virtues of the city and then turns to the virtues of the soul. Socrates uses a method of inquiry to identify the virtues of the city and soul that relies on the functional theory of virtue.[2] Given that the city is complex, we should expect it to have more than one function and, indeed, Santas identifies three, corresponding to the three parts of the city: to provision itself, to protect itself, and to rule itself. From here it is a matter of locating the virtues of the city in relation to these functions. This works well for wisdom and courage. The city is able to rule itself well if it has wise rulers; it is able to guard itself well if it has courageous auxiliaries. But instead of finding one virtue that applies to the function of provisioning, we get two holistic virtues: temperance and justice. Social temperance obtains when the parts of the city agree about who should rule. Social justice obtains when the members of the city engage in the professions they are best suited for.[3] These two virtues together enable the city to perform all of its functions better. Notably, we do not get any particular virtue that is directed specifically at the function of provisioning the city.

We see an analogous treatment of the soul in chapter five. The soul has three functions that correspond to the three parts of the soul: to rule oneself, to defend oneself, and to provide for one's bodily needs (90). Two virtues -- wisdom and courage -- follow directly from the functions of ruling and defending oneself. The other two virtues -- temperance and justice -- are holistic and enable the soul to perform all of its functions well. As with the city, we do not find one particular virtue that follows from the appetite's particular function. Thus we see Socrates's accounts of social and personal justice. Social justice obtains when, as Santas writes, "each of the natural kinds of people in it performs its own (its optimal) social function" (90). Personal justice obtains when each of the natural parts of the soul performs its own psychic function.

It isn't until the last chapter of his book that Santas turns to consider whether we ought to prefer Plato's accounts of justice to the accounts offered earlier by Thrasymachus and Glaucon. In this final chapter he inquires into both social and personal justice, asking three questions of each: (1) is this actually an account of justice? (2) is this the best account of justice that we get? and (3) does Socrates show that, under his account of justice, the just life is preferable to the unjust life? Santas works through each these questions in some detail, but let me mention just one point. When considering whether personal justice should actually be considered justice, Santas sides with David Sachs[4], arguing that the state that Socrates describes lacks a sufficiently adequate connection to conventional justice and so should be considered something more like psychological health rather than justice. Thus, even if this is a beneficial state, Socrates has not shown us that we should prefer justice to injustice. And to that extent, it seems, the Republic must fail as an argument for justice (even if it succeeds as an argument for the value of having a well ordered soul).

While I take this to be the main thread of argument, much of the book is made up of a series of digressions and side-investigations stemming from this larger thread. Three of the most prominent digressions are given their own chapters. In chapter six, Santas looks closely at the role of women in Plato's city and whether we should consider Plato a feminist. In chapter seven he considers some of Plato's metaphysical and epistemological commitments, offering an account of the Forms and looking more closely at the standards required for knowledge. In chapter eight he examines Plato's criticisms of democracy, looking both to Socrates's proposals regarding property and wealth in books three and four and at his discussion of democracy in book eight.

Santas also introduces shorter digressions throughout all of the chapters, asking, amongst other questions, how we might expand Glaucon's account of justice given its brevity in the text, about the nature of the relationship between the city and soul, whether the parts of the soul should be considered agents or capacities, whether theRepublic is elitist (and if so, in what ways), how to understand the Form of the Good, and what would happen to the account of justice if we were to drop the metaphysical and epistemological commitments in the middle books. It is these digressions that are the real strength of this book. While I did not agree with all of Santas's conclusions, I found these asides interesting and provoking.

Despite the strength of these discussions, though, there are certain passages about which Santas is almost entirely silent but that I think should be addressed in any book that endeavors to explain Plato's views regarding justice. The first omission is any sustained treatment of the moral education described in books two and three. This omission is perhaps a bit surprising, given the importance that Santas ascribes to education throughout his book. Indeed, in his discussion of whether Plato's social justice benefits all individuals in the ideal city, Santas writes: "It is no accident that the Republic contains long stretches on education: the primary good that Plato's social justice directly distributes, excellence in careers based on innate abilities, absolutely requires education of those innate abilities" (200). In pointing to the importance of education, though, Santas focuses not on the moral education prescribed in the Republic but rather on the vocational training that those in Plato's city will receive. But Plato is almost completely silent on vocational education, focusing instead on the moral education of the guardians and auxiliary and the mathematical education required for knowledge of the good. And of these courses of education, Santas is almost completely silent.[5]

Why is Santas's silence on the moral education problematic? Socrates is quite brief in his characterization of the virtues in book four. After his arguments showing the tripartition of the soul, Socrates spends just two and a half Stephanus pages (441c-444a) describing the virtues. This leaves many unanswered questions about, e.g., the sort of knowledge the rational part must have in order to be wise, how spirit can be tamed in order to follow reason, the relationship between spirit and reason, and how one can attempt to put her soul in order. These would be unanswered questions, that is, were it not for Socrates's lengthy discussion of moral education that precedes his discussion of the virtues.[6] There, in the discussion of moral education, we learn much more about Socrates's moral psychology and the content of his ethical commitments. We see Socrates already distinguishing between two parts of the soul -- reason and spirit -- and discussing how they interact with each other and are affected by outside forces, including the body, good and bad art, music, games, and physical education. Thus we learn how the parts of the soul can be shaped for good or for ill, and we see the lengthy process that is involved in putting the soul into its proper order. This isn't something that can happen overnight or with a wish and a prayer. It is a process that takes years and requires careful and ever-present attention.

Moreover, thinking about virtue in the context of moral education makes it clear how much of one's virtue is dependent on the sort of upbringing she received as a child. The proper moral education is, we learn, necessary for virtue.[7] Why? Because it is the moral education that stabilizes and harmonizes the soul and imparts the right moral content to ensure that the soul will, as a result, have the appropriate structure and be informed by the right beliefs.[8] This is an important realization for readers of the Republic, because it affects the question of why they should be just. If virtue requires a moral education like the one described in books two and three, and I know that I have not been the lucky recipient of that sort of moral education, then I should reasonably question whether Socrates's arguments regarding the benefits of justice are persuasive for me (unjust person that I am). I do not mean to imply that one cannot offer reasons for why Socrates's defenses of justice pertain even for those who are not the beneficiaries of adequate moral educations, but instead to suggest that the questions may not even get raised if we overlook the central role that moral education plays in Plato's account of virtue.

The second and perhaps biggest omission that I see in the book is any systematic discussion of the degenerate cities and souls in books eight and nine. Santas devotes a chapter to discussing Socrates's criticisms of democracy and the democratic character, but that is the extent of his engagement with this lengthy and important passage. It is here, after all, where we see Socrates's primary discussion of injustice, both in the city and the soul. We are offered a vivid account of human psychology, about the motivations and outside forces that result in the degeneration of cities and souls, and we see the effects of that degeneration. As with the moral education above, these discussions can help us understand the nature of virtue by placing unjust cities and souls in contrast to the good city and soul. The information we can glean about an agent's psychology can help inform our view of the psychology of the good individual, and Socrates’s statements regarding the various unjust constitutions can help us better understand his commitments in political philosophy.

But the importance of books eight and nine go far beyond helping us better understand Plato's views of the good city and good soul. This section serves as one of the culminating arguments for why one should be just rather than unjust. The accounts of cities and souls in those books are vivid illustrations of the breakdown and damage that injustice effects on cities and souls. At the end of the portrait of the tyrant, both the participants of the dialogue and we the readers of it are left shocked at how terrible the tyrant's life is, especially in contrast to the philosopher whose portrait is developed in earlier books. Glaucon reasons (as surely readers are also meant to) that the happiness of each life should be ranked "in the order of their appearance" and, Socrates concludes:

Shall we, then, hire a herald, or shall I myself announce that the son of Ariston has given his verdict that the best, the most just, and the most happy is the most kingly, who rules like a king over himself, and that the worst, the most unjust, and the most wretched is the most tyrannical, who tyrannizes himself and the city he rules? (580bc)

This is the first great proof for the value of the just life. And yet this proof, and the portrait of the cities and souls that play a key role in it, is not discussed by Santas.[9]

I'm very sympathetic to the fact that you cannot include every passage from the Republic in a book on it, particularly a book with the focus and feel of Santas's. But it is important to include those passages that are crucial to the argument, as I think that both of the above passages are.[10] In saying this, though, I certainly do not mean to diminish what I take to be a real value of Santas's book. Someone who reads it will come away with an appreciation for the continued relevance and value of the arguments in the Republic, and that is, in my mind, something very good indeed.


Lear, Gabriel Richardson (2006) "Plato on Learning to Love Beauty," in G. Santas, ed., The Blackwell Gide to Plato's Republic, Oxford.

Sachs, David (1963) "A Fallacy in Plato's Republic," The Philosophical Review, 72: 141-158.

[1] He looks to Rawls most often, but also to Hume, Mill, Adam Smith, and Amartya Sen, amongst others.

[2] According to the functional theory, the virtue and goodness of an object is found by looking to its function and then trying to isolate the qualities that enable it to perform that function well. Every thing that has a function has an associated virtue. Thus if I want to know the virtue of a saw, I should try to identify its function, figure out when it performs that function well, and then try to identify what quality or feature is responsible for its performing that function well. It is this quality or feature that is the virtue of that object. Goodness is brought in, too, insofar as an object that performs its function well as a result of its virtues should be considered good of its kind. Thus a good saw is a saw that performs its function (sawing) well on account of its virtue(s). Santas's discussion of the functional theory is on pp. 63-7.

[3] That people are suited to particular vocations and the subsequent implications for justice is a central theme in Santas's book. Because of space limitations, I won't be able to address it.

[4] In his paper "A Fallacy in Plato's Republic."

[5] Santas does, briefly, address moral education as a way for Socrates to respond to the Sachs problem (on pp. 205-6). He has a similarly brief discussion of the mathematical education on pp. 145-6 in the context of a discussion of whether Plato is elitist.

[6] With the exception of the first example: it isn't until books six and seven when we learn what sort of knowledge one must have in order to be wise. But in the discussion of the moral education (at 401ff) we do see how certain capacities are developed that will help the youth when they then turn to their theoretical education.

[7] At 492e Socrates declares that "there isn't now, hasn't been in the past, nor ever will be in the future anyone with a character so unusual that he has been educated to virtue in spite of the contrary education he received from the mob." The only exception to this is someone who has been saved by divine dispensation. What counts as 'proper' is open for debate. It, surely, doesn't have to look exactly like Socrates's, but it has to be at least enough like it (see 497a-d).

[8] This is clearest with respect to moderation and justice. At 441e-442a, Socrates argues that the moral education "stretches and nurtures" the reasoning and spirited parts of the soul so that they are able to govern the appetitive part. Without this training of the parts, appetite will be left to grow and take over the soul, resulting in injustice. One is wise on account of the "knowledge of what is advantageous for each part and for the whole soul" (442c). But this knowledge, we learn in books six and seven, requires knowledge of the good which is gotten via dialectic. Dialectic, though, is dangerous. In his discussion of it, Socrates states that they must ensure that those who engage in dialectic have the appropriately ordered and stable soul because, without this, they will become misologists and moral skeptics (537dff). The case for the importance of courage is perhaps most difficult to make. Gabriel Lear, in "Plato on Learning to Love Beauty", though, offers a convincing argument that the moral education, particularly in its poetic characterizations of fine and beautiful actions and individuals, is central to training the spirit to be directed toward the fine, because when it is directed toward the fine "it is open to the persuasion of reason" and thus able to be properly courageous (120).

[9] Santas does talk, briefly, about the arguments for pleasure that constitute the second and third great proofs for the happiness of the just person, focusing almost exclusively on the second pleasure argument.

[10] If nothing else, it's worth noting that Plato devotes just about three books to them (almost half of book two and book three on education, book eight and half of book nine to the degeneration of cities and souls).