Understanding Scientific Understanding

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Henk W. de Regt, Understanding Scientific Understanding, Oxford University Press, 2017, 301pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780190652913.

Reviewed by Kareem Khalifa, Middlebury College


The sciences seek to enhance our understanding of empirical phenomena. But what does this understanding involve? Arguably, Henk de Regt is the foremost philosopher of science to have underscored this question's importance. So, this book -- which creatively synthesizes two decades of his work into an elegant and provocative account of scientific understanding -- is a much anticipated and welcome addition to the literature.

De Regt's book makes two central claims. First, the aims of science require intelligible theories (Chapter 2). De Regt argues as follows: (P1) providing correct explanations is an epistemic aim of science; (P2) correct explanations require scientists to use intelligible theories; so, (C) the epistemic aims of science require intelligible theories. Here and throughout, "using" a theory is exercising the requisite judgment and skills needed to construct explanatory models of the phenomena. De Regt's core idea, however, is the notion of intelligibility, which is given two glosses. The first gloss is a "macro-level" characterization, intended to apply to science as a whole:

Intelligibility: the value that scientists attribute to the cluster of qualities of a theory (in one or more of its representations) that facilitate the use of the theory.

In this formulation, the theoretical "qualities" denote a wide variety of explanatory desiderata, including simplicity, scope, familiarity, causation, unification, mechanism, and visualizability. This leads to de Regt's second core claim: intelligibility is context-sensitive (Chapter 4). Using a variety of examples from the history of physics, de Regt argues that different scientists place greater value on different clusters of qualities. Scientists' skills are the crucial contextual determinants of which of these clusters furnish intelligibility.

However, in this skeletal form, one might worry that too much is being thrown into a contextualist catchall to be illuminating. To de Regt's credit, he offers a "meso-level" account of intelligibility,[1] the Criterion for the Intelligibility of Theories (CIT1), which specifies how a wide array of quantitative physical sciences realize this macro-level characterization of intelligibility:

A scientific theory T (in one or more of its representations) is intelligible for scientists (in context C) if they can recognize the qualitatively characteristic consequences of T without performing exact calculations.

Although de Regt offers no other criteria of intelligibility, CIT1's offering of only sufficient conditions and its subscript suggest that theories can be intelligible in other ways, e.g. in ways that do not involve qualitative reasoning. De Regt illustrates CIT1's power by interpreting nearly three centuries' worth of physics in accordance with it, while also showing that no single cluster of qualities was effective in all of this history's episodes. In particular, the bulk of this history goes to showing that realism and reductionism (Chapter 4), various metaphysical principles (Chapter 5), mechanism (Chapter 6), and visualizability (Chapter 7) are all effective ways of realizing CIT1 in some but not all scientific contexts.

On the basis of these considerations, de Regt offers the following Criterion of Understanding Phenomena (CUP):

A phenomenon P is understood scientifically if and only if there is an explanation of P that is based on an intelligible theory T and conforms to the basic epistemic values of empirical adequacy and internal consistency.

In addition to its reliance on the aforementioned concept(s) of intelligibility, CUP has two other notable features. First, in keeping with his contextualism, de Regt uses examples from the history of science to argue that scientific explanations do not conform to a single template (Chapter 3). Thus, only some explanations are causal, only some are unifying, and so on. Second, de Regt construes empirical adequacy and consistency as values because "there may be variation in how these values are ranked and applied in specific cases" (38). He takes them to be "basic" because, unlike the aforementioned values (simplicity, scope, familiarity, causation, and so on), every scientific explanation must exhibit these two values to some degree.

The overall picture of understanding that emerges is commendable on several fronts. De Regt's discussion of the aims of science helps to rekindle an interesting topic in general philosophy of science that has languished for some time. Additionally, de Regt's rereading of the history of physics with intelligibility and understanding at the forefront highlights underappreciated connections between different physicists' approaches to theory construction. Finally, de Regt threads the needle between empiricism, which denigrates the epistemic importance of understanding, and realism, which tethers understanding to accurate representations of nature's workings. The result is a highly novel and suggestive middle path in which understanding is of epistemic importance even though its connection to accuracy is relatively slack. All told, de Regt's book provides a novel and productive framework for interpreting many aspects of scientific practice.

My fondness for this book notwithstanding, there are four areas in which de Regt could have developed his account in greater detail. Begin with the argument for his first central thesis, that science requires intelligible theories. Its first premise (P1 above) states that correct explanations are among science's epistemic aims. However, this assumption's defensibility hinges on what it means for something to be an epistemic aim, and de Regt is not explicit on this front. Consider a fairly standard empiricist gloss on explanatory value: explanations are of epistemic value only insofar as they are a means to saving the phenomena. On such a view, explanation is not an epistemic aim of science because its epistemic value is wholly instrumental. Thus, any non-instrumental explanatory value is non-epistemic, e.g. explanations' utility as psychological crutches or in serving scientists' practical interests. Absent further discussion of his axiological framework, it is unclear how de Regt distances himself from this particular conception of explanation and understanding. However, he cannot accept this conception without rendering the aforementioned argument unsound.

Second, one may challenge de Regt's contention that correct explanations need only be intelligible, empirically adequate, and consistent. For instance, just-so stories appear capable of meeting these criteria, but it is hard to see why such ad hoc explanations would confer understanding or serve as suitable epistemic aims of science. De Regt's treatment of empirical adequacy and consistency as values (rather than as strict requirements) makes these constraints even more malleable, which further compounds this worry. Had de Regt engaged these problems head-on, these concerns might well have been assuaged.

Third, CUP requires explanations to be "based on" intelligible theories. It is unclear what this means. Given the pains to which de Regt goes to establish that understanding is not merely subjective, an explanation that is nothing more than psychologically associated with certain theoretical elements does not seem "based on" that theory. However, de Regt only tells us that this basing relation is not restricted to deriving the explanation from the theory. Similarly, it is unclear how much theory understanding requires. On the one hand, to defend CUP's sufficiency, de Regt wishes to rule out intelligent design as an intelligible theory, on the grounds that it lacks theoretical principles that "can be used to construct specific, empirically adequate explanations of concrete phenomena" (95). On the other hand, to defend CUP's necessity, de Regt claims that several special sciences -- most notably psychology and sociology -- only rely upon "loosely circumscribed theoretical principles" (97). However, it is not obvious that these latter theoretical principles are in better standing than intelligent design's when it comes to constructing good explanations.

Fourth, the connections between CUP and more traditional philosophical accounts of scientific explanation are occasionally puzzling. It would be in the spirit of de Regt's contextualist approach if he first identified an explanation using whatever theory of explanation was apt for the phenomenon, and then used criteria such as CIT1 to determine whether or not the explanation provided understanding of that phenomenon. However, at times, de Regt seems eager to show that CUP not only tells us when an explanation provides understanding, but when it is an explanation at all. For instance, he feels obliged to show that CUP "solves" some well-known puzzles that any account of explanation ought to address, such as the fact that the length of a shadow does not explain the height of the flagpole that casts it. His response is essentially a bullet-biting one: in some contexts, shadows explain heights. However, the burden of an adequate solution to the symmetry problem would only be a worry if CUP had the further requirement that an explanation of P is based on an intelligible theory T if a description of P is a consequence of some of T's principles.[2] Since CUP does not entail this, and de Regt seems reluctant to characterize how explanations are "based on" theories in purely deductive terms, it is unclear why he has shouldered this particular burden of proof.

None of these concerns, however, undermine the unique and intriguing character of de Regt's book. Rather, they are best seen as requests for elaboration. In this way, they are further occasions to continue the philosophical discussions about understanding that de Regt has so artfully cultivated over the years.

[1] Meso-level standards of intelligibility characterize a particular scientific community's norms regarding understanding. De Regt also describes individual or micro-level standards of intelligibility, but these do not figure prominently in his account.

[2] Perhaps de Regt further intends that this consequence is qualitative and recognized by scientists without exact calculation?