Understanding Space-Time: The Philosophical Development of Physics from Newton to Einstein

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Robert DiSalle, Understanding Space-Time: The Philosophical Development of Physics from Newton to Einstein, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 173pp., $84.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521857901.

Reviewed by Carl Hoefer, ICREA/Universitat Autònoma de Barcelona


The philosophy of space-time physics is currently in high gear, with outstanding and long-awaited books recently published by Harvey Brown (Physical Relativity) and Robert DiSalle, and others forthcoming soon from Nick Huggett and Oliver Pooley. All of these authors approach their work primarily as philosophers, yet each incorporates historical exegesis quite essentially in the course of making his philosophical case (each, I should add, in a different style and with different aims). This review is about DiSalle's Understanding Space-Time (US), but due to their overlapping topics and temporal proximity, some comparisons with Brown's book will be made in passing. (See Brad Skow's NDPR review of Brown, http://ndpr.nd.edu/review.cfm?id=6603.) Despite the topical overlap, US and Physical Relativity are very different works -- different, but largely complementary.

DiSalle's goals are very ambitious, and in broad terms they are threefold. He wants to (1) direct philosophers away from the canonical absolute/relational disputes, (2) reshape our understanding of the motivations, arguments, and achievements of the two giants of space-time physics (Newton and Einstein), and (3) refute, in passing, the Kuhnian view that the main paradigm changes in space-time physics are essentially arational and impossible to justify via non-circular arguments. Any reader, no matter how conservative and wedded to the traditions DiSalle is attacking, will not fail to be impressed by the insights, both historical and philosophical, offered in the course of working toward these three goals.

Aside from brief introductory and concluding chapters (both very useful), US is composed of three long chapters: one on the achievements of Newton, one on the advances of the 19th century (including Kant as that century's initial instigator of progress), and one on the philosophical roots of Einstein's relativity theories, special and general (SR & GR). The book's structure is clear and the path of argument is linear and chronological, and in that sense easy to follow. Nonetheless, the story DiSalle tells is complicated and at times it can be difficult to situate the contents of a rich subsection into the overall plan. But DiSalle provides the solution to any such difficulty: each main chapter has its own introduction and concluding section, which tie things together clearly and make plain what the author hopes to have shown. This clarity is a major virtue of US.

DiSalle begins by summarizing the potted history of space-time philosophy that he rejects: the narrative made traditional in the 20th century in which the absolute-relational dispute is paramount, and victory achieved in Einstein's GR either by the relationists (the Reichenbach/positivist line) or by the absolutists (the Earman/early-Friedman line). Over the course of the book, DiSalle demonstrates convincingly that at most of the historically crucial moments there was a lot more going on in the thoughts and arguments of the major figures than the traditional focus on absolute-vs-relational allows us to see. While there have been other authors making this sort of point before, DiSalle offers the most sustained, highly revisionist account yet of the entire standard history from Principia to GR. DiSalle thinks that the absolute-relational controversy should cease to be the main focus of historical (and philosophical) inquiry once and for all. Whether this is a good philosophical prescription or not, I think that as practiced by DiSalle it occasionally has a somewhat distorting effect on our historical understanding. For example, DiSalle maintains that Leibnizian indiscernibility arguments are completely irrelevant for assessing the acceptability of Newton's absolute space (p. 26) -- but Samuel Clarke, who was in close contact with Newton, did not think them misdirected. Another example is that DiSalle doesn’t mention the theological aspect of Newton's absolute space, presumably since it is irrelevant to what he wants to highlight: that absolute space was put forward by Newton as a necessary framework presupposed by the mechanical concepts and laws accepted not just by Newton but also his contemporaries such as Leibniz and Huyghens. "What must be the nature of space and time, in order for the world to be as it appears to be, and to follow the natural laws that it appears to follow? This is Newton's question" (p. 42).

This transcendental-type approach to understanding the nature of space and time is the cornerstone of DiSalle's treatment of Newton, Kant (of course), Helmholtz, Poincaré (with caveats), and especially Einstein. It is also the key to DiSalle's goal (3) of contesting Kuhnian a-rationalism. To the extent that we can reconstruct Newton's achievements, as well as those of the 19th century and of Einstein, as logically well-founded responses to a combination of empirical and prior-concept-use constraints, we can show that the "revolutions" in the history of space-time physics were dialectically sound responses to definite problems and can be seen as simply reforming the conceptual scheme in ways that achieved consistency with the essential parts of existing practice together with empirical adequacy. This is an attractive picture compared to the Kuhnian picture of incommensurability and wholesale replacement, with a new paradigm being defensible only circularly from within its own, largely non-empirical foundations. Indeed, DiSalle recurs frequently and effectively to the concept of dialectic, portraying the advances in our understanding of space and time as emerging naturally and logically from already-present roots.

As beguiling as DiSalle's narrative may be -- and, despite the occasional tendency to ignore significant historical elements, especially where these involve absolute/relational arguments, it is usually a plausible (and often convincing) narrative -- it falls short of giving the ideal sort of response to Kuhn. What DiSalle shows is that reforms to our concepts of space and time by for example, Einstein, were backed by sound dialectical argument and consistent with both empirical constraints and established physical concept deployment. But DiSalle does not show that these reforms were necessary or non-contingent, in the sense of being the only possible way forward for physics at that moment of time.[1] This is not a defect of DiSalle's anti-Kuhn efforts, because he should not be faulted for failing to establish something that is in fact false! The Kuhnian picture, though over-done in some ways, is surely right to maintain that competent physics could have taken us onto paths that diverge from those actually taken. What DiSalle's narrative does is effectively counter the idea that revolutionary changes in our space/time concepts have been largely a-rational and supported (at best) by circular or question-begging arguments. DiSalle gives us clear progress at each revolutionary juncture, if not inevitability.

The revolution handled most straightforwardly and successfully by DiSalle is the overthrow of classical space and time in Einstein's special relativity theory (sections 4.1 - 4.3). DiSalle effectively shows how the foundation of SR is to be found in Einstein's philosophical critique of simultaneity. Where the positivists saw a conventionally stipulated, operational/coordinative definition of simultaneity, DiSalle sketches a much deeper story in which Einstein grappled with the apparent conflict between the invariance properties of electrodynamics and the classical notion of simultaneity (absolute), eventually realizing that one must stick with what was most central in physical deployment of the concept of simultaneity -- the criterion of distant simultaneity given by light signals -- even though in the end this will undermine the classical (absolute) intuitive notion of simultaneity. Section 4.2 is a tour de force in which DiSalle succeeds in showing Einstein's reasoning to have been far more subtle, dialectical and argument-based than the conventionalist/positivist story admits. (Again, though, we pay a price in historical completeness, as in DiSalle's story Einstein's philosophical commitment to the relativity of motion plays no role at all.)

DiSalle's treatment of special relativity is almost completely different from Harvey Brown's in Physical Relativity (PR). Whereas Brown engages deeply with technical details of the physical theories pre-1905 and focuses much attention on coordinate systems, transformations and relativity postulates, DiSalle's treatment is almost entirely non-mathematical, and focuses on Einstein's philosophical analysis of simultaneity to the near-exclusion of relativity postulates. Despite the lack of overlap their arguments and conclusions seem to me not to be in conflict or competition, and to be largely complementary. In particular the discussion of Minkowski space-time in section 4.3 of US agrees with Brown in denying that postulating Minkowski space-time as an "entity" allows one to do explanatory work that is not already doable on the basis of the laws of SR themselves. And like Brown, DiSalle spends some time meditating on a distinction that Einstein himself emphasized, between "principle theories" and "constructive theories". The former establish general constraints that must be respected by all other physical theories, and allow us to prove important laws and generalizations, without (arguably) offering an explanation of them. The latter, by contrast, offer dynamical/mechanical explanations of phenomena on the basis of the arrangements of their constituent parts and the laws they obey. Like classical thermodynamics, SR is a principle theory, and it establishes a constraint on all other physical theories, namely that they should be Lorentz-covariant. But on the question of principle theories vs. constructive theories, DiSalle and Brown do diverge in one important respect. Brown argues that ultimately a constructive/dynamical theory ought to be found that can explain the postulates of a principal-type space-time theory like SR. There ought, ideally, to be some quantum-mechanical derivation of the nature of solid bodies such as rigid rods, or the behavior of wind-up clocks, that allows one to deduce that the former will contract when moved at high velocities, and that the latter will run slowly. DiSalle appears not to think that any such replacement-from-below is possible in the case of space-time theories -- for all space-time theories, from Newton to GR, are inherently principle theories (pp. 119-120). They are frameworks established "for the interpretation of phenomena, not a kind of mechanism or hypothesis to explain them" (120). As long as a constructive theory, quantum or otherwise, presupposes some space-time framework which is itself conceptually tied to our conventional standards for measuring distance and time, no non-circular explanation of "why" rods and clocks behave as they do would seem to be possible.

In the remainder of US DiSalle offers a narrative concerning the discovery and justification of GR and its curved non-Euclidean space-times that follows a pattern similar to those sketched for Newton's introduction of absolute space and time and Einstein's SR. Here too, DiSalle views as mostly irrelevant the alleged epistemological motivations for GR that Einstein himself emphasized so strongly in 1916, so closely bound up with the traditional absolute-relational dispute. While they undoubtedly played some roles in Einstein's thought processes, particularly a motivational role, they were based on a mare's nest of confusions and were neither clearly defined, nor satisfied by the final GR theory. Instead of relativity-of-motion principles, what really gave rise to GR was Einstein's dialectical critique of gravity, inertia and acceleration, based on the Equivalence Principle. DiSalle's reconstruction of the argument for GR based on the standard Newtonian notion of an inertial frame plus the equivalence principle in section 4.4 is again ingenious and intrinsically persuasive. It provides a wonderful, non-technical introduction to the conceptual novelty of GR, and clearly displays it as a plausible, well-motivated reform of the concepts of inertia and gravitation already found in Newtonian physics. But despite DiSalle's stated intentions, it does not seem to me that this section gives us an accurate historical account of Einstein's path to GR. Instead it offers a narrative of how Einstein might have arrived at and argued for GR had he been primarily focused on the equivalence principle and not on Machian relativity of motion and inertia.[2] DiSalle's reconstructed argument for GR is not in fact, as far as I can see, an argument for GR per se, but rather an argument for a generally covariant theory that geometrizes away gravitational force -- and there are other theories that match this description! It is telling that DiSalle does not discuss the Einstein field equations themselves; but of course, for Einstein himself, his specific field equations, and the Machian/relationist interpretation that he thought they admitted, were crucial.[3]

By setting the GR field equations off to one side, DiSalle also puts out of view a feature of GR that many have thought crucially distinguishes it from other space-time theories: its "background independence", or lack of any prior/absolute geometrical space/time structure. This brings us back to the absolute-relational debates that DiSalle wishes to put to rest. Though these debates can and should be set aside when they distract, devolve into terminological quibbles, or simply cannot be resolved, neither physicists nor philosophers with any sort of realist bent can be satisfied with having nothing to say about the ontological status of space-time. Nor is DiSalle himself neutral on this question; at various places in US we see that DiSalle thinks absolutist/substantivalist positions clearly have the upper hand. What's more, it seems likely that DiSalle's understanding of space-time as substantial is in line with the "sophisticated substantivalism" approach that views geometrical structure as fundamental and point-identity an irrelevant distraction (as noted before, DiSalle dismisses Leibniz's identity of indiscernibles arguments as unimportant (p. 26): Newton himself ought to have been a sophisticated substantivalist!).

This goes hand in hand with DiSalle's treatment of general covariance as a merely formal requirement, unconnected with relativity of motion or relationism. While he acknowledges (p. 124) that physicists and philosophers still debate whether there might be a more substantive notion of general covariance that only GR satisfies (an idea often linked to background independence), DiSalle prefers to see GR as of a piece with earlier theories (Newtonian and SR). The distinctive roles that space-time structures play in the foundations of physical theory -- as partly conventions, partly a priori presuppositions, and partly empirically discovered facts -- can be seen clearly throughout the history traced in US. DiSalle's stated hope is to have clarified and deepened our understanding of these mixed roles. Of possible future quantum gravity theories, which may yet again revolutionize our ideas of the nature of space-time structure, DiSalle concludes

If philosophers and physicists are to make philosophical sense of such a structure, surely they will require a clear understanding -- clearer, at any rate, than twentieth century philosophy of science was able to achieve -- of what the role of space-time structure really was, and how it functioned as a framework for other physical objects, interactions, and processes. I hope that this book has been a step toward that understanding.

Minor quibbles to one side, this reviewer certainly feels that DiSalle has achieved his goal. Understanding Space-Time is a unique and extremely valuable new addition to the philosophy of space-time physics, offering a clear and philosophically compelling view of space-time that combines the best of realism/substantivalism, conventionalism, and neo-Kantian a priorism. It will deservedly become required reading for all who wish to -- well, understand space-time.[4]

[1] Occasionally DiSalle's language almost seems to hint at such non-contingency. But in several places he makes clear that he views each major transition as involving contingent elements. However, DiSalle does not make very clear how much contingency he is prepared to allow, and from what origins. Nor does he address the Kuhnian contention that differences in scientific values can make it impossible to say that a paradigm-changing theory represents unequivocal progress over its predecessor. DiSalle sketches both the Newtonian and Einsteinian revolutions in a way that makes clear to modern eyes (including mine) that the conceptual changes were progressive, but his narratives will not convince any die-hard radical Kuhnians or social constructivists.

[2] DiSalle is aware that his reconstruction may strike the reader as historically implausible, and he defends his reconstruction by pointing out that it is close to how two early GR experts -- Weyl and Eddington -- understood the theory. I agree with DiSalle's description of Weyl's and Eddington's views, but it should be remembered that in the early years of GR Einstein disagreed, often vigorously, with the interpretations preferred by most other experts. For example, deSitter, who introduced Eddington to GR, belittled Mach's Principle and Einstein's understanding of the relativity of inertia, and discovered one of the first anti-Machian cosmological models. Einstein argued fiercely against deSitter and his space-time model, which makes no sense if the equivalence principle was paramount in Einstein's thinking (EP being perfectly respected in the deSitter cosmology).

[3] It is true however, as many GR texts point out, that if one starts from the assumption that space-time is locally of Lorentz-Minkowski structure and decides to capture gravity as space-time curvature, then the GR field equations are the simplest and most natural ones able to yield Newtonian gravity in the appropriate weak-field limit.

[4] Work related to the writing of this review was supported by the Spanish government grant HUM2005-07187-C03-02. Special thanks to Lina Jansson and Kevin Coffey for discussions of Understanding Space-Time during my stay at the University of Michigan, and for comments on an earlier draft of this review.