Understanding the Many

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Yi, Byeong-Uk, Understanding the Many, Routledge, 2002, 140pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415938643.

Reviewed by Jim Hardy, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


Byeong-uk Yi’s Understanding the Many is a collection of five essays designed to convince us that we ought to take plural subjects seriously and also presenting several forays into the theory of plurality. The essays comprised Yi’s 1995 dissertation at UCLA and are presented in that form with only “stylistic changes”. Yi’s primary thesis is that there is a fundamental difference in what one says by uttering, “Tom is a child and Jane is a child” versus “Tom and Jane are two children.” Yi maintains that the second sentence commits us to a logic of plurals, that accounts of its meaning which appeal only to singular subjects cannot explain its logical significance. He goes on to present a logic of plurals and to argue that taking plurals seriously provides various philosophical benefits over more traditional accounts.

I will spend most of my time commenting on Yi’s arguments for plurality. I won’t address Yi’s presentation of the logic of plurality beyond a few brief remarks in this paragraph. Yi’s development of the logic proceeds largely as one would expect. He does a good job of setting out the choices one needs to make in formalizing out such a logic, e.g. should predicates which seem to admit both plural and singular subjects be treated as two predicates (one singular and one plural) or as a single predicate? He explains why he makes the choices he does, but is careful to allow that the logic might be constructed somewhat differently should there turn out to be reason to make the choices differently. Beyond those choices, there is little that will surprise the reader in Yi’s logical system. This is not to say that the system is trivial; it is not, but it is a fairly natural and, I suspect, uncontroversial spelling out of Yi’s intuitions in a formal system. Once those intuitions are granted, the logic follows. While the development of the system may have been no easy chore, in retrospect there is little to wonder at.

One of the difficulties with the book’s being five essays rather than a single extended treatment, is that Yi never fully develops an argument that we must accept plurality as bona fide. Instead, each essay contains a small argument, often much the same as the previous essay. The result is that at least this reader remained largely unconvinced that admitting plurality is logically required. The most extended argument occurs in the first chapter, but echoes of it are seen throughout the book. Yi notes that not all plural constructions can be routinely expressed in standard predicate logic. The only viable options thus seem to be taking plural constructions as bona fide in their own right, or reducing them to set theoretic constructions. Thus the statement “Russell and Quine are two philosophers” must be taken either as asserting that the property [being two philosophers] is instantiated by the plural subject [Russell and Quine], or as asserting that the set {Russell, Quine} is two membered and that each of its members is a philosopher. Yi argues that the latter interpretation must be rejected and hence the former must be accepted. Yi’s argument for rejecting the set-theoretic interpretation is essentially that the set-theoretic interpretation logically implies “there is something of which Russell is a member” whereas the original sentence does not. Thus, the set-theoretic interpretation is not logically equivalent to the original sentence and cannot be taken as giving its meaning. Since it is uncontroversial that the set-theoretic interpretation does imply the existence of a set with Russell as a member, Yi’s argument hinges on his claim that the original construction carries no such implication.

Yi gives two basic arguments for this claim. The first is that the implication is not supported by elementary logic, and thus anyone who accepts the implication must reject elementary logic. The second is that the existence of certain sets is a matter of metaphysics rather than logic. Thus, even if it is metaphysically necessary that Russell is a member of something if he is a philosopher, it is not logically necessary. But this means that the implication is not logically valid. As this is primarily a review, I won’t give detailed responses to each of these arguments, but I do want to give some brief indication of why I think they are insufficient. In the first case, it seems odd to me that Yi considers the rejection of elementary logic as a reason for not accepting the implication. After all, one only need reject elementary logic in the sense of maintaining that there are some valid inferences, which are not captured by elementary logic. But almost everyone already rejects elementary logic in this sense. Specifically, Yi himself rejects elementary logic in this sense. His entire book rests on the premise that elementary logic is insufficient to capture all valid inferences regarding plurals. So, if this argument is effective, then it is also effective against Yi’s major thesis. In the second case, Yi is certainly right to distinguish metaphysical from logical necessity. However, unless Yi has some fairly clear account of logical necessity that doesn’t depend on a prior notion of logical validity, this argument begs the question. But Yi presents no such account, nor, to the best of my knowledge, is such an account readily available in the literature. So, it seems that Yi’s second argument is also insufficient to ground his claim.

Still, if philosophy investigated only those subjects which were forced upon it, it would be a poor discipline indeed. I now turn to Yi’s arguments regarding the benefits of plurality. These are harder to catalog, and not the least of them is the simple argument that we have, courtesy of Yi’s work, a coherent and fairly natural account of plurality. This account allows our semantic analysis of certain kinds of sentences to more closely follow the surface structure of those sentences. In general, there is a presumption in favor of semantics that follow surface structure more closely. This presumption is especially strong if the semantic theory can mirror surface structure in an elegant fashion without introducing excessive complexity. I think that Yi’s theory meets the criteria for this presumption. Yi’s account provides a fairly intuitive extension of first-order semantics, one that brings our interpretation of natural-language sentences more in line with their surface structure. It does so without radically changing the nature or complexity of the semantics, and indeed one might argue that the resulting interpretations are less complex than they would be on a more traditional account. So whether or not we are logically compelled to accept something like Yi’s theory, I think there is a lot to be said for it. We do, after all, use plural constructions in natural languages. Given the syntactic similarity between “John is a child” and “John and Mary are two children”, it makes sense that there should also be a close similarity between their semantics. By treating [John and Mary] as a plural subject and [being two children] as a plural predicate, the latter sentence is of subject-predicate form in both its syntax and its semantics. Thus, the syntactic similarity between the two sentences is mirrored at the semantic level.

But Yi believes there are other benefits to be gained by his theory. Specifically, he claims that his account of plural properties yields a more acceptable notion of number than does the traditional view. In addition, he claims that it provides a more coherent account of how sets depend on their members. I think that this latter claim is among the more interesting in the book, though the argument for it raises some general questions about the interpretation of Yi’s theory.

Yi claims that numbers are best seen as properties. Specifically, the number 1 is the property [being one thing], the number 2 is the property [being two things], and so on. Thus on Yi’s account numbers just are plural properties. Thus any argument which favors Yi’s account of numbers would eo ipso be an argument in favor of plurality. But why should we accept that numbers are properties? Yi begins by arguing that numbers cannot be set-like objects. His reasoning is that “John and Mary are two children” carries no implication about the existence of set-like objects containing John as a member, but the traditional set-theoretic accounts of numbers do carry such an implication. Because the “two” in “John and Mary are two children” is best understood as marking a property, we cannot interpret “2” in “2+1=3” as referencing a set-like object without undermining inferences such as “John and Mary are two children, Robin is another child. Thus John, Mary, and Robin are three children because 2+1=3.” The inference can only make sense if “two” and “2” have the same semantic content. Of course, Yi cannot accept the surface structure of “2+1=3” as giving its semantic structure since the numerals occur as terms rather than as predicates. Instead, he offers the following gloss: “ If some things are two things and if something is one thing that is not one of the former, then the former and the latter are three things (and vice versa).” Now clearly Yi’s interpretation preserves the validity of the inference. But it is less clear how Yi’s interpretation will scale to more complex numerical statements. For example, what is it, on Yi’s analysis, for a number to be prime or negative or complex? His account of complex numbers must take them as properties or we will lose the validity of other inferences. But what kind of properties might they be? I don’t mean to claim that such an account is impossible, but it is at least unclear how it would go. And if it cannot be cashed out, then Yi’s argument does not stand, regardless of its prima facie plausibility.

Finally, Yi proposes that his account provides a better understanding of how sets are related to their members. Given a population of ur-elements, the question arises, What sets of ur-elements are there? Yi argues that the answer, “Any collection of ur-elements is a set thereof”, begs the question. After all, we might go on to ask, “What collections of ur-elements are there?” Collections are just too much like sets to be of any use in really answering the initial question. Yi proposes instead that we answer the original question by saying, “Any number of ur-elements forms a set”, which is to be cashed out as “If there are some ur-elements, then they form a set.” This in turn can be put into semi-formal language as “If there are some us such that us are ur-elements, then there is a set x such that us form x.” Here “us” is a plural variable and “there are some us” is a plural quantifier. If Yi’s account can withstand rigorous application to set theory, then it would offer an advantage over more standard accounts in that it could better answer the important question “What sets are there?” However there are substantial worries about whether it can withstand rigorous application. For example, what of the empty set? The existential nature of Yi’s formalization means that it cannot account for the existence of the empty set. So, the empty set will have to be added separately. But this means that Yi’s theory does not give a complete answer to the question. A deeper problem—and one that threatens Yi’s theory as a whole—is the nature of plural quantification. It cannot be understood substitutionally since the number of sets will generally outstrip the linguistic resources available to refer to them. (This is because sentences must be of finite length, and there are more subsets of natural numbers than there are finite strings of a finite alphabet.) But neither can Yi appeal to model-theoretic accounts of quantification. Yi uses a typical set-theoretic model, so this would have the quantification depending on some prior notion of set. Essentially, Yi must tell us what satisfies the open formula “us form a set.” But his answer cannot be just a listing of the ur-elements since that is the answer to what satisfies the singular form of the open formula. If plural variables are to be understood as really distinct from singular variables, the question of what satisfies open formulas containing them must be different. Neither can he give a substitutional answer since not every set of us will have a finite string that uniquely picks it out. Neither can he appeal to satisfaction in the model, as this would involve tacit appeal to sets. Finally, he can’t simply say that the formula is satisfied by the ur-elements taken any number at a time, as this would clearly beg the question. It is unclear what answer is left.

In short, Yi’s book is a good first foray into the issues surrounding plurality. Readers wanting to begin thinking about the subject should find it interesting and provocative. However it lacks the depth of analysis that one would want in a complete treatment of the subject. This is in part due to its being a collection of semi-independent essays and in part due to it’s brevity, just 103 pages of main text. It is a provocative and interesting first step towards a theory, but leaves too much unanswered and uncompleted to be seen as a full treatment.