Understanding Torture

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J. Jeremy Wisnewski, Understanding Torture, Edinburgh University Press, 2010, 273pp., $37.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780748635382.

Reviewed by Brian Feltham, University of Reading


Though very topical thanks to recent events, moral debate over torture is nothing new -- it is, of course, as old as torture itself. While focusing on more recent debates, this new book does a terrific job of situating them within the broader history of torture before mounting a sustained argument against its practice. It is a work of applied ethics and is aimed primarily at non-experts in both the discipline and the topic, while at the same time making an original contribution to the debate. While this would be a great book for anyone to read, it is clearly of particular use to students (most likely undergraduates) taking a course in applied ethics generally or the ethics of war in particular. There is some discussion of broader ethical theories (though perhaps not as much as would be ideal for more philosophical courses), and there is some good discussion of general philosophical methodologies (which would make it excellent for those less familiar with philosophy, such as politics or war studies students). Wisnewski approaches his subject holistically: looking at the history of torture, its role in judicial procedure and its legal status, and -- most importantly -- the reality of torture: what it is like to be tortured, to live with having been tortured, to perform torture, and what the broader social and political implications might be. As Wisnewski makes clear, it is not an easy matter even to understand what torture is -- and he intends that his whole book should be read as (in part) an attempt to explain this. While introductory in nature, the book is organised as a sustained line of argument for the unconditional moral wrongness of torture. This is a position I share; though as I shall outline below, I am not persuaded that Wisnewski's own arguments are entirely successful.

Wisnewski begins and ends with the claim that we are 'homo torquere, homo tormentum -- the animal who tortures and is tortured' (p. 3, p. 238). This rhetoric is regrettably weak. We are the only animal that does lots of things; the only animal that writes and reads emails or, more pertinently, the only animal that prosecutes wars. This does nothing to capture why we should be worried about torture and what, if anything, is morally special about it. Over the course of the book we get a fuller sense of how many people may live with a real sense of the imminent possibility of torture and how this may affect the quality of their lives; but even so, this is hardly a defining characteristic of the human animal and the human condition. Fortunately, this rhetoric does not spoil the actual flow of the argument. Torture is wisely presented as a product of culture, with a history and broader social role. Just the same approach would be necessary in considering the morality of war. The structure of the book is clear (and sign-posted throughout): first we get a working understanding of torture, then we see why it is prima facie wrong, then we consider arguments that there are exceptions when the context and gravity of the situation might justify torture.

After an orienting introduction, the book begins with a chapter on the history of torture which is especially strong in its treatment of the changes in the role of torture in law through the medieval period and into the modern. This chapter is very illuminating about the formal evidentiary role of torture, which becomes understandable in a context where the burden of proof is very high; nevertheless, these same procedures were always accompanied by questions about the reliability of torture as a guide to the truth. There is also an important discussion of why torture receded from standard criminal law; Wisnewski makes a compelling case that these legal reforms developed in a way largely independent of arguments about both morality and efficacy. But ultimately, the true purpose of this chapter is to (begin to) explore the nature of torture itself, as distinct from other things we might do to one another. Here, the interest is less in definitions than in getting a basic grasp of the reality of torture, something that is vital to Wisnewski's overall case against it. Throughout the book it becomes clearer that the reason it can be so easy to think that torture can be morally acceptable is not just that people may have naïve beliefs about its efficacy, but also a weak grasp of a) what it is to be tortured and to live with having been tortured; b) what socially must be in place in order to practice torture; and c) what it is to live together as potential torturers and victims of torture.

The next chapter is on the basic wrongness of torture and it does, on the whole, a good job of persuading us that torture is something on the whole that is to be avoided and something that, even were it to be morally permissible, would be regrettable. This, of course, is not hard work. What is hard, and what is necessary for Wisnewski's strategy, is getting a clear sense of the moral specialness of torture such that exceptional cases are particularly difficult to defend. This is not nearly so well achieved. In fact, it is not until a later chapter that he directly tackles the comparison with killing. Wisnewski favours the view that chief among the moral failings of torture is that it aims and tends to destroy people's autonomy. The victim's agency is undermined until he is no longer a fully functioning practical agent; his own agency has been subverted by the torture and for the purposes of the torturer.

This is important and true; but killing people destroys their agency too (and, for that matter, blackmail, bribery and legal sanctions all subvert agency). Certainly, there is something horrific about the way that with torture 'after one's destruction, one must live through the effects' (p. 122); but (at best) this marks it out as worse than death. And not only is this hard to swallow in every case, it is hard to see why this would make exceptions to the prohibition on torture distinctively difficult to maintain. It may be worse than (some) killings; but how does this figure in assessments of its wrongness? Is torture never permissible to avoid any number of deaths? It is salutary to be reminded that torture is horrible; but in a context of war (as opposed to regular policing) most of what we do is pretty horrible and very much of it aims to destroy people. And, for example, much bombing is not just an attempt to kill and destroy, but also to subvert the enemy's agency by lowering their morale -- ideally so that their desire becomes primarily that the war end rather than that they win it. Indeed, even the training of soldiers aims to break them down and rebuild them as something new, dedicated to a new purpose. I do not disagree with Wisnewksi's position here, but I am frustrated by the inadequacy of his defence of it.

There is a general problem here, and one of which Wisnewski is often keenly aware himself: the fundamental reasons that torture is so specially horrific are actually surprisingly abstract given the visceral nature of torture itself (examples include not only discussions of autonomy but also of human dignity). This abstractness also makes them elusive; which further means that they are controversial. It is very easy to accept some fundamental moral idea and yet to disagree about any particular application. You care about community? About the moral importance of human lives? About the value of freedom and autonomy? 'Yes' answers here really don't help make the case against torture. And yet merely laying out the horrible features of torture and its social practice doesn't help explain why it should be placed beyond the pale of emergency measures. As aware as Wisnewski is of these difficulties, he never successfully gets over them.

The centre-piece of much argument about torture is the ticking bomb scenario and Wisnewski's ultimate failure to mount a successful case for his conclusion can be traced to his fascinating but flawed attempt to grapple with this example. In this scenario, we are invited to imagine that we have a suspect who knows how to prevent a bomb going off that will kill very many civilians; we know both that we cannot elicit this information without torture and that torture may well succeed. And the clock is ticking. One standard response to this thought experiment is to argue for its irrelevance: such cases are not standard, and torture would not work if they ever did occur. But Wisnewski wants to go further and argue that the scenario, while seeming possible/intelligible, is in fact incoherent. A point of comparison offered to explain his argument is the idea of a reddish-green colour. It may at first seem possible, but in fact it isn't -- those two colours don't stand next to each other on the colour spectrum. Thus it is not a coherent idea: that is, given our colour concepts (which we formed in response to our colour experience) it is not merely physically but also logically impossible: it cannot be thought coherently, intelligibly. Can it be true that the ticking bomb scenario is not merely unlikely but is in fact strictly speaking unintelligible?

In this review I can't hope to counter every one of Wisnewski's arguments, but I will just look at one: that torture takes too long to be viable in ticking bomb cases. If time is against us, then torture is not the answer. So, once we face up to truths about how torture works, it must be that torture can never be a likely resort. (Another argument adds that 'working' means giving information that can't be got by other means -- so if more time were available, other measures would be too.) The argument here is great if we are concerned with the practical likelihood of ticking bomb cases; but it is terrible as an argument for incoherence. Leaving aside science fictional ways of stretching time in pocket torture dimensions, we have the simple possibility of a bomber who wants to keep her mouth shut but is pathologically unable to lie (or has a conspicuous 'tell') and who is also unable to take any amount of torture. Unlikely, yes; but not incoherent. And if the ticking bomb case is not incoherent, then it can still do its job. Wisnewski calls it a wedge argument; it elicits from many the judgement that torture cannot always be wrong. And this, of course, changes the discussion to one of determining when it is or isn't wrong. If it is not incoherent, then the ticking bomb case may still be able to do that, and perhaps open the way to much more. (I think it doesn't; but not because the case itself is incoherent.)

The consideration of other arguments for and against torture, the effects of torture, and the explorations of the psychology of torture are all strong but less distinctive. The key points are covered: dirty hands (must leaders resort to wrong actions)’ the difference between whether torture should be illegal and whether it is immoral’ the nature and relevance of emergency situations’ the nature and relevance of general critiques of absolute morality, and so on. There is also a helpful chapter reviewing recent legal wrangling over the meaning of 'torture' in law. Aside from the lamentable use of the derogatory term 'Bush League', which risks alienating some of the potential audience through a cheap joke, this provides an excellent case study of institutional torture.

While I think that Wisnewski's overall strategy fails, nevertheless much of the detailed argumentation is very strong. The case presented that torture doesn't work is weaker than it could have been (it gets a section plus incidental discussion here and there, but strangely doesn't receive a chapter of its own); but many other lines of argument are explored better here than in much of the existing literature. In fact, Wisnewski's own lines of argument are often so striking that it is a shame that so much of his discussion is built around quotations from other writers. This is, of course, a great help in an introductory book; but it leaves less space for Wisnewski to speak at length in his own voice. Happily, in the concluding chapter he allows himself to become both more expansive and more theoretical.

Wisnewski has written a wonderful book to serve as a basis for seminar discussions. The level of detailed discussion of standard arguments and the richness of the references and substantial quotations make this an ideal primer; and the impassioned, principled stance combined with a clear intent to be fair minded about the reach of arguments makes it a great example to students. Those minded to agree or disagree will have received plenty of material to help them form and refine their positions and arguments. However, it does not serve so well as a substantial contribution to the ongoing debate, in large part because so much of the discussion involves repeating what others have said. But it does still make a valuable and thought-provoking contribution; and, to be fair, no book can serve every purpose equally well. I will certainly be adding this to my own reading lists for students; and as someone already familiar with the debate, I still found much here worthy of engagement. The arguments are always interesting and never fail through lack of cleverness.