Unequivocal Justice

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Christopher Freiman, Unequivocal Justice, Routledge, 2017, 157 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138628229.

Reviewed by Andrew I. Cohen, Georgia State University


John Rawls famously defends two principles of justice as those to which free and equal persons would agree. These principles apply to the basic structure of society. The basic structure includes the norms and institutions determining fundamental "rights, liberties, and opportunities" that any person needs, regardless of her particular aims.[1] In his engaging and provocative book, Christopher Freiman argues that Rawlsians often wrongly dismiss free market systems as vehicles for realizing justice. Rawlsians are guilty of a "self-obviating idealization" (11): they assume an injustice makes robust redistributive states necessary, but ignore how that injustice perverts state institutions. Though Freiman might not convince many Rawlsians, he poses an important methodological challenge for liberal political philosophies that move between ideal and nonideal theorizing.

Freiman's main target is one model of ideal political theorizing. On that model, people comply with institutionalized principles of justice. Certain norms and institutions are needed to remedy shortfalls from justice. The problem, Freiman says, is this model's inconsistent idealization regarding the state. If we take seriously the assumption that people will strictly comply with justice, then we do not need a state. But if we relax idealizing assumptions and admit that people do not strictly comply with justice, then we must acknowledge the possibility that the state is an institution that can (and often will) fail. It fails by falling prey to the same sorts of vices and collective action problems that made it necessary.

Throughout this book, Freiman insists that any political theorizing that explores how to promote justice must give parity of analysis to actors across institutional contexts. We cannot suppose people will be saints in government but sinners in the marketplace (26). This sort of "asymmetry" would give short shrift to alternative systems for securing justice. Freiman is clearly quite skeptical of Rawlsian defenses of redistributive states and impressed by the power of market institutions to secure liberal justice. But his book is not a defense of laissez faire capitalism -- at least, it is not mainly so. His prime targets are those liberals who quickly discount anything resembling a "system of natural liberty" as a way to realize liberal justice. That system upholds efficiency and opens careers to all. Rawls had worried that it allows distributive shares to depend on morally arbitrary factors such as "accident and good fortune."[2] Freiman argues, however, that Rawls and many other liberals wrongly dismiss market systems.

As Freiman implores, "We should compare like to like" (27). We should make the same sort of behavioral assumptions across alternative interpretations of institutions for securing justice. Once we do that, the system of natural liberty becomes a viable interpretation of liberal justice. Indeed, as Freiman argues in several chapters, state regulatory institutions reliably (and unsurprisingly) fail to deliver on the political liberty, economic sufficiency, fair opportunity, and social equality that are part of liberal justice. Though he only sketches how market institutions might do a much better job than a regulatory state at promoting liberal justice, his main point is "to criticize egalitarians' methodology in evaluating regime types. We must consistently apply our assumptions" (78). He thus hopes to open the door for honest symmetric political theorizing. As he discusses in cases involving occupational licensing, housing, trade, education, risk regulation, intellectual property, and consumer protection, it is hardly obvious that redistributive states do better at realizing liberal justice than free markets. Freiman's argument is thus an important challenge to Rawlsian dismissals of market institutions.

Critics will defend Rawlsian political theorizing from Freiman's challenge. There are at least three ways they might respond. One is to deny that typical modern liberal approaches are guilty of illicitly assuming behavioral asymmetry. Another is to defend the asymmetry. A third possible reply is to bracket the asymmetry worry and argue that anything resembling the system of natural liberty is incompatible with liberal justice.

Consider the first possible reply: perhaps modern liberal political theorists are not guilty of Freiman's charges. They make the same behavioral assumptions across regime types and so minimal state market systems fail in a fair contest with the more activist Rawlsian state. The problem with this reply, as Freiman argues (e.g., chs. 2, 7), is that many leading modern liberal theorists (such as Samuel Freeman, Elizabeth Anderson, Gregory Kavka, and Rawls himself) seem at times to be vulnerable to the charge of asymmetry. They may seem not to give parity of analysis to various systems for promoting justice.

A more promising reply might be a defense of asymmetry. Freiman reviews Rawls's argument for some such position. Briefly, Rawls admitted that some idealizing assumptions are needed for political actors. While economists show us the pursuit of self-interest tends toward mutual economic advantage, there are no such invisible hand explanations available for the political realm, and so we must suppose there a commitment to public justice (34-35). Freiman rejects this. He asks us to imagine a "Twin Rawls" who, like Rawls, gives lexical priority to equal basic liberty, and who defends the view that any departures from social and economic equality must be justifiable to the least well off (28). Twin Rawls, however, supports little or no state. As Twin Rawls says, we may attribute to actors in the marketplace a concern with promoting liberal justice, but in politics we know that people are viciously self-interested. Consequently, Twin Rawls adds, we must reject from the start any statist interpretations of liberal justice. Obviously, we would reject Twin Rawlsianism as a facile dismissal of the state for realizing justice. Similarly, Freiman argues, we should be suspicious of any liberal statist argument such as a Rawlsian one that helps itself to behavioral asymmetry.

Freiman's critics will find this unpersuasive. They could regroup and offer another defense of asymmetry. They will worry that Freiman is throwing out the baby (the state) with the bathwater (pernicious self-regard that has significant negative externalities). They might suggest keeping the cute baby. Their argument could proceed as follows:

People need a referee. Much political philosophy disputes who or what that referee may be and what it may do. Despite substantive differences, people will agree that a referee should ensure agents may interact according to publicly known and stable rules. Those mutually acceptable rules provide the framework for each person to realize her goals. The danger, however, is that the referee will be inefficient, inept, or corrupt.

Thus far, Freiman would emphatically agree with critics.

A liberal defense of asymmetry might then argue that people will create a referee, or more precisely, refereeing institutions, so that special reasons apply to actors within the institutions. Persons inhabiting these regulatory institutions are empowered to change the reasons that apply to interacting agents. The familiar Hobbesian defense of the state, for instance, says individuals rationally agree to submit to the rule of some sovereign power. That sovereign changes the weight of the reasons that apply to people. Where, before instituting the sovereign, it may have seemed that the balance of reasons favored uncooperative behavior, the sovereign's incontestable power guarantees a mutually beneficial context for interaction and helps to eliminate collective action problems and the risk of uncooperative exploitation.

Many modern liberals will resist Hobbes's authoritarian conclusions, but they will agree that we need some refereeing institutions to help us to resolve disputes and get along with one another. For referees to do what we want and need of them, some liberals might then argue that we must carefully structure the refereeing institutions to carve out the space for behavioral asymmetry. In short, the refereed (or those who want to be refereed) have reasons to create an institutional environment so that different reasons apply to the referees than apply to the refereed.

The danger of various types of refereeing failure is so great that people will create and promote norms, practices, and institutions that help to select as referees those who are best able to treat only certain reasons as relevant when refereeing, e.g., reasons of public justice. The refereed would then also agree to design and be bound by institutions that respond to any corruption with massive penalties for all involved. Moreover, the refereed will design and promote background institutions so that people come to expect and demand upright refereeing. They will educate the young to regard the referees with awe and respect. They will hold up the referees for public adulation. They will treat the referees' pronouncements as unique sources of special reasons for action that apply to everyone. There is and must be some behavioral asymmetry: the regulators are bound by reasons that do not and need not apply to those they referee.

However we might fill in this sketch of a defense of asymmetry, Freiman will surely agree that we need referees. He might agree that different reasons apply to them. He would likely respond, however, by restating his worries about asymmetry. The very processes by which we all supposedly select referees and by which we design the institutions that empower them are all fraught with the same vices and assurance problems that make referees necessary (47-50). The logic of democratic politics includes dispersing costs but concentrating benefits, as well as encouraging ignorant expression of uninformed political preferences that are poorly responsive to reason (142-46). Freiman's likely rejoinder would then be formidable: once we acknowledge the pitfalls of collective action in democratic political contexts, we should consider alternative accounts of reducing or avoiding such costs. Parties other than the state might referee, or, at least, perhaps a state should do less than Rawlsians typically allow. A lot will depend on empirical details.

The third and final reply to Freiman's argument that I will consider is distinct from any concerns about symmetry. This would be a worry about the market institutions Freiman partially defends. Freiman admits that much will hang on empirical details. Perhaps not everything will.

Some critics of unbridled market institutions worry about the totalizing logic of the marketplace. The freedom and prosperity free markets provide are neither self-interpreting nor self-justifying. GA Cohen, for instance,[3] warns that many libertarian defenses of free markets risk crowding out alternative forms of life. As Elizabeth Anderson notes,[4] market norms privilege mere preference over rational attitudes, discount the significance of certain oppressive relationships, and discount the value of goods and relationships we can enjoy only outside market contexts. Market norms, Anderson seems to worry, sometimes undermine autonomy.

Freiman's likely rejoinder seems mainly consequentialist. He notes that a free market can unleash spectacular creativity that may open up opportunities, not only for material progress, but moral progress as well. A free market might, for instance, make it easier to flourish as a poet. The market makes the goods the poet needs cheaper. Moreover, the growth markets provide has an important moral benefit. Consider the washing machine. As it became more widely available, it liberated people, typically women, from domestic drudgery and opened up opportunities to pursue other forms of life than spending part of each day stooped over a tub of hot water with a washboard. Less regulated markets, Freiman argues, might then do better at providing for the least well off, and even manufacture new bases for status than mere economic standing (ch. 6).

Critics might be unimpressed. The prosperity markets unleash comes with certain opportunity costs. As GA Cohen maintains,[5] a political morality that defends markets free of much (or any) state interference must instead privilege certain sorts of freedoms over others. Freiman only sketches a defense of a free market in his book. It is not clear, however, from and to what that free market is free.

Freiman defends a free market and opposes the "regulative and redistributive state" (76). The alternative he thinks Rawlsians fail to take seriously is some sort of a market system. The label he sometimes uses is "libertarian" (e.g., ch. 7). That system is presumably not interventionist in the way a Rawlsian liberal state might be (see, e.g., ch. 5). At many points, he mentions that Rawlsians should consider whether unregulated markets might better realize liberal justice than regulated ones (e.g., 92). Freiman does not wish to defend any particular market system because, again, his target is liberal dismissals of less regulated systems. But it is at once unclear what sort of regulation it is we might be better off without. For surely the free market system to which Freiman is sympathetic needs to constrain its participants in some ways.

Whether we call it "regulation" or something else, typical free markets must prevent participants from imposing their wills, at least sometimes, on others. They must have institutions to arbitrate (at least some) disputes and help undo (at least some) damage that some persons cause others. They must have a rule of law.

Freiman would surely agree that free markets require some oversight and remedial institutions. He questions whether those must be state institutions, i.e., institutions with a monopoly on the use of coercive force (56). More precisely, he questions political theorists who blithely dismiss nonstate institutions as vehicles for securing liberal justice. Nonstate institutions (or smaller states) might better help avoid collective action problems, secure equal basic rights, promote equal opportunity, and promote prosperity for all, especially including the least well off.

Freiman's deliberately underdeveloped defense of the market thus seems ultimately to be a sort of liberal justice consequentialism. Critics may worry, however, that some rules or norms must constrain the market itself, at least partly out of respect for the moral values liberal justice expresses. It is unclear what, if anything, Freiman would allow to serve as such constraints. Whatever they are, I bet he would think nonstate institutions could provide them.

Freiman does not tell us what form nonstate institutions must take if they are to promote liberal justice. He discusses what they might look like, and, in doing so, claims to demonstrate the "theoretical possibility" that libertarian institutions are viable for securing liberal justice (136). Freiman argues that less regulated political economies, in at least some forms congenial to free market proponents, might promote autonomy, reason, cooperation, and status pluralism better than the more regulatory states congenial to modern liberal political theorists. This is a compelling challenge to Rawlsian liberalism. Much now hangs on empirical details. Freiman asks proponents of liberal justice to give nonstate alternatives more of a hearing.

[1] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice, revised edition (Belknap Press, 1999), 12.

[2] Rawls, A Theory of Justice, 63.

[3] G. A. Cohen, Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality (Cambridge University Press, 1995), chaps. 1-2.

[4] Elizabeth Anderson, Value in Ethics and Economics (Harvard University Press, 1993), chap. 7.

[5] Cohen, Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality, chap. 2.