Unifying Hinduism: Philosophy and Identity in Indian Intellectual History

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Andrew J. Nicholson, Unifying Hinduism: Philosophy and Identity in Indian Intellectual History, Columbia University Press, 2010, 266pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231149860.

Reviewed by Richard P. Hayes, The University of New Mexico


Over the years there has been a spirited controversy over the question of whether Hinduism is best understood as one of the world's oldest unified religious traditions with a core set of values and practices, or as little more than a convenient label imposed by outsiders on a wide range of beliefs and practices that have little in common except that they have had their home in what we now call India. It is well known that the term "Hindu" was first used by Muslims to refer to all the religions in the Asian subcontinent east of the Indus river system, and that the term was originally applied to Buddhists and Jains as well as to followers of the Brahmanical systems of thought and practice. While the term "Hindu" may have originally signified nothing much more than the word "Indian," it is now commonly used to refer to all or most of the religions currently found in India except Buddhism, Jainism, Sikhism, Judaism, Christianity and Islam. The question, then, is whether all the beliefs and practices that fall within the denotation of the term "Hindu" have a single connotation. One of the projects of Nicholson's book is to explore that question. A second project, which turns out to be related intimately to the first, is to explore the thought of a sixteenth-century commentator named Vijñānabhikṣu, whose work has been evaluated differently by different modern scholars and philosophers. The relation between these two projects is Nicholson's thesis that the very idea of the unity of Hinduism is neither an ancient idea nor an artifact of outside colonizers of the Asian subcontinent but rather a conviction that dates back to the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries -- a conviction promoted by Vijñānabhikṣu among others.

Vijñānabhikṣu's work has been known in the West since the early nineteenth century. Henry Thomas Colebrooke (1756-1837) referred to him extensively in his lectures on Hindu philosophy delivered at the Royal Asiatic Society in London between 1823 and 1827, and Richard Garbe (1857-1927) of the University of Tübingen translated his commentary to the Sāṃkhyasūtras into German in 1889. Despite the extensive reliance on Vijñānabhikṣu's commentaries as guides to the complex Sāṃkhya philosophy, many of the early accounts of Vijñānabhikṣu's thought by European scholars were rather dismissive of his contributions, characterizing him as confused and idiosyncratic.

Nicholson's view, which he works out in some detail in several different chapters of his book, is that the low esteem that Western scholars had for Vijñānabhikṣu may have stemmed from their conviction that the essence of Hinduism was the non-dualist (advaita) interpretation of the Upaniṣads (vedānta) based on the well-known ninth-century Advaita Vedāntin philosopher Śaṅkara. Since Vijñānabhikṣu was highly critical of Śaṅkara's form of Vedānta, Europeans tended to see him as someone who had descended from the pinnacle of Indian philosophy to a less sophisticated and more primitive view. To make matters worse, Vijñānabhikṣu wrote sympathetic commentaries on several systems of Indian thought, all of which he treated as though he fully believed in them. Since European scholars tended to see these different systems as incompatible with one another and as rivals to each other, they tended to see Vijñānabhikṣu as muddled and inconsistent. In the final chapters of his book, Nicholson explores further the attitudes of the early Orientalists and speculates on why they held Śaṅkara in such high esteem that they were bound to hold a severe critic of Śaṅkara in low esteem. Before exploring that issue, however, Nicholson devotes several chapters to the philosophical position of Vijñānabhikṣu as that position was worked out in his key writings.

Coming onto the scene after three major schools of Vedānta had evolved, Vijñānabhikṣu was naturally in a position to examine all of them and offer his views on their limitations and shortcomings. Speaking very generally, he felt that all the schools that had come before him had focused too strongly on some passages of the Upaniṣads while glossing over passages that offered a different message.  Everyone before him, he thought, had regarded some passages as speaking a direct truth and therefore deserving to be taken literally, while seemingly contradictory passages were regarded as being either figurative or as being directed at an audience that was unable to grasp the highest truths and had to be given diluted doctrines that they were capable of understanding.

Vijñānabhikṣu claimed that his interpretation, in contrast to his predecessors', respected all passages as being spoken by omniscient sages who said exactly what they meant in a straightforward way. Like other commentators of his time, Vijñānabhikṣu operated on the principle that since people who are omniscient cannot disagree with one another, apparent incompatibilities in their teachings would disappear if one abandoned a superficial reading and looked more deeply for an underlying unity. This conviction that a profound unity underlay apparently contradictory statements informed not only Vijñānabhikṣu's interpretation of the Upaniṣads but also his reconciliation of schools of thought that were (and still are) generally considered to be rivals of Vedānta.

The schools of Vedānta can be seen as different ways of explaining the relationship between the one and the many, the one being brahman, the source of all things, and the many being the world of particular beings of all kinds. According to the non-dualist view promoted by Śaṅkara's followers, the unity alone is ultimately real and all the apparently different forms are illusory; another name for this view, therefore, is illusionism (vivarta-vāda). In this view, there cannot really be a relationship between the one and the many, since one of the relata, the many, does not really exist. According to Vijñānabhikṣu, this non-dualist interpretation shows an unwarranted preference for those passages of the Upaniṣads that speak of the identity of all things with brahman and say that brahman is "one without a second." An alternative view of the relation between brahman and the many is that the pluriform world evolves out of the one. On this view, the many things really are distinct from one another, and yet each is essentially of the same stuff as the unitary brahman. The many things are qualified and limited, while the one from which they evolve is absolute. This view is accordingly called evolutionism (pariṇāma-vāda). The position advocated by Vijñānabhikṣu is, he claimed, different from both those positions; it is called bhedābheda-vāda, which Nicholson renders "difference and non-difference."

Critics of Vijñānabhikṣu, both medieval and modern, said that his view is unintelligible, since it patently violates the law of contradiction. How can something be both identical to and different from another? Nicholson explains that Vijñānabhikṣu explains away the apparent contradiction in various ways.  He went out of his way to use the highly technical vocabulary of the most advanced logicians of his time to show that he was not merely ignorant of a basic law of logic. An individual self, part of the manifold world, is not non-different from the unitary brahman at the same time as it is different. In the same way that one can say it is both day and night on one calendar day, but not at the same time, one can say that the individual selves are initially not differentiated from brahman. Later, they individuate themselves qualitatively, while still being of the same essence as brahman; they are qualitatively different in that each of the individual selves and forms is only a small part of the whole brahman. This is the condition of the unenlightened individual person experiencing rebirth in the world of suffering; she is a part of the whole that is qualitatively distinguishable from the whole. Upon attaining liberation (mokṣa) from the bondage of the world of pain, the individual self is once again non-different from brahman. The full subtleties of this doctrine, which can only be hinted at in the limited space of a review, are explained nicely by Nicholson in the third chapter of his study.

The process of attaining mokṣa, according to Vijñānabhikṣu, involves two components. First, it is important to have a correct intellectual understanding of the relationship between brahman and the pluriform world, of which the individual soul is a part. That understanding is gained through a study of the root texts of Vedānta and a reliable commentary (Vijñānabhikṣu's, of course, being the most reliable and Śaṅkara's the least). The second component of a program leading to liberation is the practice of yoga as explained by Patañjali's Yoga-sūtra, to which Vijñānabhikṣu also wrote a commentary. Yoga is the liberative practice par excellence, and it is based upon the ontology and epistemology of the Sāṃkhya school; this school, therefore, is also worthy of study, and so Vijñānabhikṣu also wrote commentaries to its key texts. So while the Sāṃkhya school came under attack in the writings of Śaṅkara and his followers, it is regarded as fully compatible with and complementary to the key Vedānta texts.

Sāṃkhya, Yoga and Bhedābheda Vedānta are thus regarded as an integrated whole by Vijñānabhikṣu, and although he does not use the term Hindu, this whole is the very core of a unified religion, the one we moderns call Hinduism. Not part of Vijñānabhikṣu's harmonious unified Hinduism, of course, is classical Advaita Vedānta. If one were to use the terminology of Christianity -- an issue that Nicholson explores in interesting ways in chapters eight and nine of his book -- Advaita Vedānta is seen by Vijñānabhikṣu as a kind of heresy, a deviation from the core message of Hinduism that if followed would almost surely thwart one's attempts to attain liberation.

The Sāṃkhya system as described by Vijñānabhikṣu is a theistic philosophy, which is contrary to the way that Sāṃkhya is described in almost all Western literature, where it has, until recently, usually been portrayed as an atheistic system of thought. Nicholson draws upon the scholarship of Johannes Bronkhorst and others who have challenged the view that Sāṃkhya was originally atheistic. There is no doubt that there were late Sāṃkhyas who were decidedly atheistic and who used almost exactly the same arguments against the possibility of God's existence as the Buddhists had used, but there is no evidence that the earliest Sāṃkhya texts shared this atheistic tendency. What is interesting about Vijñānabhikṣu's commentaries on Sāṃkhya is that he defends a robust theism while commenting on the very Sāṃkhya texts that were uncompromisingly atheistic. The fancy footwork that this required is delightfully described in chapter five, entitled "Reading against the grain of the Sāṃkhyasūtras." There are several dimensions to Vijñānabhikṣu's attempt to explain away the unmistakable atheism of the text he is commenting upon, one of the key claims being that the arguments for atheism were meant as an antidote to the spiritual pride that some people might develop if they thought they were closer to God than they actually were. The atheistic passages, then, were according to Vijñānabhikṣu written for a very specific audience and should not be taken as the predominant views of the Sāṃkhya philosophers.

The exposition of Vijñānabhikṣu's philosophy occupies the central chapters of Nicholson's book. This exposition is framed by the modern debate over whether Hinduism is an ancient religion that has always been unified despite its apparent diversity or is essentially the invention of modern Orientalists. As mentioned above, Nicholson's claim is that the notion of a unified Hinduism is neither ancient (in the sense of going back several centuries before the Christian era) nor a recent invention of Western colonizers of the Asian subcontinent. Rather, he claims the notion of a unified Hinduism can be traced back to the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries, where it appears prominently in the works of what may be called doxographers, that is, people who wrote descriptions of various schools of Indian philosophy. The usual format of these doxographers was to distinguish between schools that accepted the authority of the Veda and those that did not. Those who rejected the Veda were the Jains, Buddhists and various materialistic schools that promoted a this-worldly hedonism. Normally these Veda-repudiating schools were placed at the bottom of a spiritual hierarchy with materialism representing the lowest level of consciousness and Buddhism being just barely an improvement. The Veda-affirming philosophical systems occupied the higher ranges of the hierarchy, with the school favored by the doxographer being at the pinnacle.

This manner of portraying schools of Indian thought suggested that there was an essential unity among those schools that affirmed the Veda. As Nicholson points out, this supposed unity does not bear up well under careful historical scrutiny, given that the Sāṃkhya school was every bit as critical of Vedic rituals as the Buddhists and Jains ever were. That notwithstanding, perhaps because Sāṃkhya was closely associated with Yoga, and Yoga eventually came to be seen as a practice useful to students of Vedānta, Sāṃkhya came to be regarded as part of the unified front against the Veda-deniers. This unified set of schools, which included Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika as well as Sāṃkhya, Yoga and the Vedānta schools, came to be seen long before the arrival of Europeans as versions of a unified religion. The contribution of Europeans was to apply the term "Hinduism" to that unified set of Veda-affirming schools.

In the final chapters, Nicholson offers possible answers to several questions that naturally arise. One question is: why did Indian authors of the fifteenth and sixteenth century come to see schools that had spent more than a millennium attacking and denigrating each other as united? And why did Indian doxographers bother to talk about Buddhism at all, since it had all but disappeared from India by the time the doxographies were written? Nicholson's hypothesis was that the perceived need for unity may have been brought about by the political threat posed by Islam, which had been introduced to India by invading Arabs, Turks and Persians. There is, however, no mention at all of Islam in the writings of the doxographers. How might we explain its absence? Nicholson makes the intriguing suggestion that attacking the memory of anti-Vedic Buddhists may have been politically more prudent than attacking the real presence of anti-Vedic Muslims. A second question that Nicholson explores is: why did Europeans see Advaita Vedānta as the essence of Hinduism, especially since that philosophy was probably favored by a minority of Indians? A possible answer to that, suggests Nicholson, is that it may have been politically expedient to the colonizers to portray Indians as other-worldly visionaries who regarded this world as an illusion. Such people would obviously need the help of scientific-minded, progressive Europeans.

Whether or not one agrees with Nicholson's many interesting hypotheses, his book is a rich feast of historical and philosophical details carefully and lucidly laid out in a well-written presentation.