Unity and Plurality: Logic, Philosophy, and Linguistics

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Massimiliano Carrara, Alexandra Arapinis, and Friederike Moltmann (eds.), Unity and Plurality: Logic, Philosophy, and Linguistics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 259pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716327.

Reviewed by Alda Mari, Institut Jean Nicod, CNRS


Natural languages exploit a variety of means to encode the notional category "plurality". In the nominal domain, the grammatical and ontological distinction between pluralities and unities is a sharp one. Consider:

(1)       a. The class is noisy.

            b. The children are wearing red today.

In (1-a), "class", while notionally plural, refers to an atomic entity, or a set, or to the unity 'class' whose members are students. Plural marking in (1-b) is used instead to refer to pluralities or multitudes. The ontological and logical status of a plurality or a multitude is still the object of debate, and the book adds to this debate interesting and highly innovative pieces of data and theory focusing mostly on grammatically marked pluralities as in (1-b).

Next consider: 

(2)       a. The children are tall.

            b. The children are surrounding the garden.

The ability of plurals to combine with both the so-called distributive (2-a) and non-distributive predicates (2-b) (Godehard Link, 1983) points to the difficulty of determining the ontological and logical underpinnings of pluralities. While (2-a) describes each of the entities of the plurality separately, (2-b) describes the plurality as a whole, posing the question of whether the plurality, in this case, is to be conceived of and analyzed as a unity or a set, or whether one should endorse a different semantics, logic and ontology for plurals free of sets, mereological sums and unities altogether.

The unequivocal answer provided by this set of papers is that pluralities as sets are a misconception. The common goal of the collection is to show how to deal with plurality without ontologically and logically committing to higher order entities such as sets. The authors stand for pluralism versus singularism and versus predicative theory of plurality as a singularism in disguise. Singularisms are refuted in many ways, from  logical to semantic perspectives. Bypassing the temptation to conceive of pluralities as unities, as in the combination of the plural with non-distributive predicates, the authors provide an intricate discussion of plurality as many and propose a variety of challenging accounts of this notion, which include exciting and promising excursions in the modal realm.

Specifically, Theodore Scaltas discusses the Platonic take on the question, arguing that in the Platonic view, pluralities are objects that partake in a Form. A property like "two" jointly qualifies the objects but does not relate them, just as "beauty" qualifies many objects at once. There is nothing peculiar to pluralities. Only those plurals that are relational seem to escape this view. Two individuals partake in the Form 'father of', but only one of them is legitimately described as 'father'. The treatment of these relational nouns is left to future research. Oystein Linnebo pursues the goal of saving Law V, according to which two open formulas φ(u) and ψ(u) define the same extension just in case they are true of the same objects, without incurring Russell's paradox, which arises from shifting individuals to sets of which these individuals are members. Linnebo's solution rests on the intriguing notion of possible sets. Alex Oliver and Timothy Smiley discuss in depth a variety of arguments against singularism and challenge predicative analyses (James Higginbotham and Barry Schein 1989) with a variety of objections, which include the notorious problem of multiplication of predicates for singular and plurals. By shifting the plural predicate to a predicate of a different order than the corresponding singular, predicates are necessarily doubled since no predicate can be of different orders simultaneously. Peter Simons develops a logic for multitudes with ontological innocence, by relying on the notion of difference. Like the previous authors, Francesca Boccuni, Massimiliano Carrara, and Enrico Martino claim ontological innocence for plurals, and defend a principle with universal applicability and cognitive primacy according to which there is no entity above those that form a plurality. Echoing the solution in Linnebo's paper, they also exploit a modal account by introducing arbitrary reference and free choiceness. The enterprise undertaken by these authors is a coherent one, and the notion of plurality as unity is shown to be unnecessary, misleading and disposable.

Likewise, across the linguistic papers the notion of plurality itself is reduced to a minimum, that is to say nothing else above and beyond the elements that constitute it. Friederike Moltmann revises her previous notion of integrated whole (Moltmann, 2007) to defend the notion of plurality as many. Byeong-uk Yi notes two problems for generalized quantifier theory (so called Bach-Peters sentences and the donkey anaphora) and proposes a logic for plurals as many things as such that also pays attention to the varieties of methods used by natural language to express pluralities (e.g. all vs. any). Thomas J. McKay argues for distinguishing mass predication from plural predication, providing new arguments for disentangling the two. With an innovative take on the question of the ontological status of pluralities and the linguistic status of plurals, Paolo Acquaviva looks at pluralities as an effect of language rather than a matter of thought or even ontology. Following Hagit Borer (2005), Acquaviva argues for plurality as a classifier of natural language or as a divider and writes:

My proposal joins Borer's radically non-lexicalist claim that it is grammar that constructs and determines the part structure of a noun's reference domain, with the conception of kinds as underpinning the ontology presupposed by natural language. Kinds, under this view, are not secondary entities abstracted from particulars, but primary, underived entities in the ontology that underlies natural language semantics.

Alexandra Arapinis tackles the question of collective responsibility, which also seems to plea for pluralities as unities (see Fred Landman 2000) to dissect the notion of a whole as integrated and consisting of parts functioning together. Across the variety of papers, the notion of plurality is dismissed from the ontological realm as an entity of its own right to be identified with its own members and ultimately to a category of natural language with no ontological substance.

Along this road a variety of questions are raised, many of which are left open, paving the way for new research. The most prominent one pertains to the individuation criteria for plurality. If a plurality is nothing beyond its elements, there must be nonetheless a principle guiding the speaker's choice of naming entities via a plural marker. Acquaviva, as just mentioned, considers kinds as primitives underpinning any use of grammatical plurals. No plurality needs to be individuated in the ontology to begin with since plurality is not a matter of being but a category of natural language and a means for classification in language. It is nonetheless to be acknowledged that natural language uses different determiners for count and mass nouns, and the question arises of the principles that ground such a linguistic fact. According to Acquaviva, concepts like WATER  and BOOK are associated with different properties which favor their encapsulation as mass or count noun. By emphasizing that what is mass / count is not the concept but the noun, the question of what in the concept favors different linguistic encapsulation is not answered and the proposal seems to maintain a certain circularity.

A series of papers points at modality as a possible and suitable candidate for spelling out the principles of individuation of pluralities, and seems to represent one of the most promising and newest advances of the collection as a whole.

Boccuni, Carrara and Martino bring to light in the logical literature the notion of free choice (though without mentioning this explicitly), establishing a framework for fruitful comparison with the linguistic literature stemming from Nirit Kadmon and Landman 1993, Veneeta Dayal, 1998, and Anastasia Giannakidou, 2001 (to mention a few). Boccuni, Carrara and Martino develop the notion of the capability of an object of being picked by the ideal agent as underlying the notion of plurality as ontologically innocent. Their thesis also resonates with recent work on assertability conditions of universal quantifiers by Alda Mari and Christian Retoré (in press) who study a variety of universal quantifiers in natural language and point to a difference in their assertability conditions and the type of statements that host them. In particular Mari and Retoré argue that universal quantification via certain quantifiers (like tout in French) is possible only if entities can be chosen 'freely' (in the technical sense). What counts as a plurality thus hinges on the method of choice of the entities that partake in the plurality, and different methods of choice can lead to individuate different types of pluralities (intensional and general vs. accidental and limited).

In spelling out the principles of individuation for wholes, Arapinis exploits the foundational notions of functional mereology: (i) the whole must possess some attribute in virtue of its status as a whole, (ii) the parts of the whole must stand in some special and characteristic relation of dependence, (iii) the whole must possess some kind of structure. By going back to the Gestalt concept of organic unities (see Peter Simons 1987) the notion of dependence is the principle for individuating wholes. As elaborated in Jacques Jayez and Mari (2005) and Mari (2003, 2005), who spells out the notion of dependence in a channel theoretic framework (Jon Barwise and Jerry Seligman, 1997), dependence can be rendered in terms of possible situations. The notion of modality is intrinsic to the one of dependent parts, and their link is still in need of more careful explorations.

Without clearly proposing a modal semantics, Linnebo also points to modal notions widening the borders of the notional category of plurality to possible entities. Going beyond possible individuals, this promising line of research will also seek to take into account perspectivization and the role of the cognitive agent in determining what counts in a context as a plurality or a multitude (see Mari 2005 on epistemic wholes). How knowledge and subjectivity enter the realm of plurality is a question to which the papers in the book lead, thus renewing the debate in a long-standing tradition that, since Plato, has still not entirely grasped what pluralities are and can be.


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Borer, Hagit 2005. In Name Only. Vol. 1 Structuring of Sense. Oxford University Press.

Dayal, Veneeta 1998. ANY as inherently modal. Linguistics and Philosophy 21: 433Ð476.

Giannakidou, Anastasia 2001. The Meaning of Free Choice. Linguistics and Philosophy 34: 659-735.

Jayez, Jacques and Mari, Alda 2005. Togetherness. In E. Maier, C. Bary, C. and J. Huitink (eds.), Proceedings Sinn und Bedeutung 9, University de Nijmegen, pp. 155-169.

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