Unorthodox Humeanism

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Georg Sparber, Unorthodox Humeanism, Ontos, 2009, 226pp., $124.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380330.

Reviewed by Hilary Greaves, Merton College, Oxford University



Sparber’s project is the articulation and defence of a variant (‘unorthodox Humeanism’) on David Lewis’s well-known metaphysical scheme, which variant he thinks retains many of the advantages of Lewisian metaphysics while avoiding some of its key disadvantages.

According to Lewisian metaphysics, the fundamental metaphysics of the world consists of a set of point-sized objects (points of spacetime or matter), instantiating fundamental intrinsic properties. The only fundamental ‘external’ relations — fundamental intrinsic relations whose instantiation does not supervene on intrinsic monadic properties of the relata — are spatiotemporal relations. All else, including causal relations, laws of nature, and non-fundamental objects and property-instantiations, supervenes on this mosaic of actual instantiations of fundamental properties.

Sparber identifies, in Lewis’s overall metaphysical picture, two key theses. The first is ‘the intrinsity postulate’ (actually two postulates): that the fundamental properties ‘are intrinsic and need nothing more than a point (of spacetime or matter) to be instantiated’ (p.151). The second thesis is categorialism: that the fundamental properties are categorical, rather than dispositional (p.151). Sparber defines ‘a property P as categorical if and only if the causal role it plays … depends on instantiations of other properties than P’; dispositional properties ‘have their causal roles determined wholly by themselves’ (pp.71-2). Lewis’s metaphysics is also ‘Humean’: that is (in Sparber’s sense), it holds, in addition to categorialism, that all fundamental properties are first-order (p.72).

Since the intrinsity postulate and categorialism are logically independent, combinations of acceptances and denials of them give us four prima facie coherent positions: orthodox Humeanism, orthodox dispositionalism, unorthodox Humeanism and unorthodox dispositionalism. Here the orthodox (unorthodox) positions are those that accept (deny) the intrinsity postulate, and the Humean (dispositionalist) positions accept (deny) categorialism. The book discusses all but the last of these positions in some depth. Chapters 1 and 2 are devoted (respectively) to the exposition of orthodox Humeanism and orthodox dispositionalism. Chapter 3 discusses several objections to orthodox Humeanism. Chapter 4 articulates unorthodox Humeanism, and argues that it avoids the problems canvassed in chapter 3. Sparber takes ‘unorthodox Humeanism’ to coincide with the position that has become known as ‘moderate ontic structural realism’ (MOSR) in the philosophy of science literature: a position according to which all fundamental properties are more-than-one-place relations, rather than monadic properties. Thus the aim is a highly appealing package: a metaphysics that retains the simplicity and clarity of Lewis’s, but avoids both objections from within metaphysics and objections from physics to Lewis’s account.

The project is amply well-motivated. Unfortunately, however, once the book moves on to presenting original arguments, the quality of argumentation is often rather poor; further, my guess is that if the arguments were cleaned up and the key notions kept clearly distinguished, little would remain of Sparber’s case for unorthodox Humeanism. The difficulty here is not one large misstep, but numerous small ones. I list a few representative examples.

Firstly: Two of Sparber’s key objections to Lewisianism are ‘the argument from quidditism’ and ‘the argument from humility’. These are, respectively, that Lewisian metaphysics is committed to quidditism and that it is committed to humility regarding which properties play which roles, and that both these commitments are prima facie strikes against a theory. But the argument that Sparber gives for the commitment to quidditism, at any rate,1 in no way relies on the premise that the fundamental properties are monadic, rather than relational, and so must impugn unorthodox Humenaism insofar as it impugns orthodox Humeanism.2 Lewis himself, of course (in ‘Ramseyan humility’), claims that nothing would prevent him from dropping quidditism while retaining the remainder of his metaphysics, if he agreed (as he does not) that anti-quidditism would be an advantage; oddly, Sparber does not discuss Lewis’s own suggested ‘way out’.

Secondly: Part of the motivation for the move from the claim that all fundamental properties are monadic to the claim that all are many-place is alleged to be that this is what one gets if one infers one’s metaphysics from current physics. The only argument supplied for this, however, is that the nonseparability displayed by entangled pairs of systems in quantum mechanics is incompatible with the claim that all fundamental non-spatiotemporal properties are monadic (pp.155-61). There remains, of course, the possibility that there are both fundamental monadic and fundamental many-place properties. Sparber claims to rule out this highly plausible possibility in a single paragraph, via the observation that the would-be remaining monadic properties, such as mass and charge, ‘cannot provide for identity conditions of quantum mechanical objects, because they are instantiated with identical values by every fundamental quantum object of a certain kind’; for instance, all electrons have the same mass and charge as one another (p.161). Nothing is said, however, about why the fact that properties in a given class do not provide ‘identity conditions’ in this sense might imply that those properties are not monadic, or that they are not fundamental, and again I am at a loss as to how to attempt a rational reconstruction of the argument. The strong claim that no fundamental property is monadic is then taken as established for the remainder of the book.

Thirdly: Sparber’s ‘intrinsity postulate’ unhelpfully runs together the notions of a property’s being intrinsic with, in effect, its being monadic. (I take it that the main point of postulating that fundamental properties ‘need nothing more than a point to be instantiated’ is that, fundamental objects being point-sized according to the metaphysics under discussion, it follows from the fact that fundamental properties need nothing more than a single object to be instantiated that they are monadic as well as intrinsic.) Since Sparber’s ‘unorthodox turn’ seems to consist entirely in moving away from monadicity, and (meanwhile) other theses going by the name of ‘structuralism’ frequently amount to the repudiation instead of intrinsic properties, it is particularly important to keep these two notions separate, and particularly difficult to keep track of exactly what has been argued for when they are not so separated.

One final comment. Much of the discussion is couched in terms of causation. For example, Sparber’s definitions of categorialism and dispositionalism turn on the notion of the causal roles of properties, and a large proportion of Sparber’s exposition and assessment of each candidate metaphysics (in chapters 1, 2 and 4) consists in an examination of whether and how the metaphysics in question can ground an adequate analysis of the notion of causation. But this is an unhelpful distraction. Sparber’s essay is supposed to be a study of fundamental metaphysics, and causation is not fundamental. It would be far more illuminating to examine the issues suggested in this book at the pre-causal level.

1 Sparber’s argument for the claim that Lewisian metaphysics is committed to humility does rely on the fact that Lewis postulates fundamental monadic properties. But it does so only via the flatly stated auxiliary premise that ‘the only properties that are knowable to us are the relations an object entertains with other objects’, and Sparber offers very little discussion of why exactly this premise should be accepted (hence very little that might put us in a position to assess whether or not ‘the unorthodox turn’ really solves the key problem) (p.141). In any case, as Sparber is surely aware, Lewis himself has a different reason for accepting humility, namely that humility follows almost immediately from quidditism. Sparber does not suggest any reason for doubting this second argument for humility.

2 Surprisingly, Sparber actually seems to recognise the basic thought behind this point, but he immediately goes on to argue that unorthodox Humeanism nevertheless is not committed to either quidditism or humility. I confess, however, that I cannot make heads or tails of this further argument. The reader may be able to do better: see pp.186-7.