Unpopular Privacy: What Must We Hide?

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Anita L. Allen, Unpopular Privacy: What Must We Hide?, Oxford University Press, 2011, 259pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195141375.

Reviewed by Judith Wagner DeCew, Clark University


This is a wonderful book, written by a prolific legal scholar and staunch privacy advocate who adds a provocative and unique perspective to the theoretical work on privacy. Allen writes with legal expertise but she is also well grounded in the philosophical literature, giving one of the most complete and detailed summaries of past defenses of privacy and its value. She also brings to the fore a wide range of legal decisions, some historical and settled, and some unclear or being revised. She clarifies that she believes privacy is a broad concept, is a foundational good for liberal democracies and liberty lovers, and that "the American right to privacy has enjoyed wide appeal for several decades now . . . protecting personal spaces, personal information, and personal choices" (19). While she agrees there is not a single definition of privacy, and recognizes that privacy is not absolute, she rejects views that privacy is a chaotic cluster and she embraces a wide variety of types of privacy, in this book focusing on what she calls physical and informational privacies.

Allen's novel contribution is the controversial conclusion that if one is committed to personal freedom, one must be prepared to endorse a government that mandates some liberty-promoting privacies for its people whether they like it or not. Inspired by feminism and American law, she notes that all coercion and paternalism should be exceptions and not the rule, as it is always better to educate, incentivize and nudge citizens. However there are particular contexts, Allen argues, when government can, does and may need to do more to enforce privacy on citizens even when it is unwanted and unpopular. She offers a contentious claim, that "privacy is so important and so neglected in contemporary life that democratic states, though liberal and feminist, could be justified in undertaking a rescue mission that includes enacting paternalistic privacy laws for the benefit of uneager beneficiaries" (xi).

To place this book in context, Allen has in previous books emphasized the importance of privacy and private choice for women, and the need to acknowledge accountability to counter privacy demands. Here, using prime examples "from seclusion and bodily modesty, to confidentiality and electronic data protection" (3), Allen urges that the importance of some privacy interests are so fundamental that there is "a place for nudging and coercing privacy which is unpopular -- that is, unwanted and even resented" (xii), and that this demand need not imply political domination of the sort that feminists and libertarians fear. Despite J.S. Mill's rejection of paternalism, American law justifies some paternalism using Mill's famous principle to prevent harm to others. Similarly, Allen believes some modest paternalism can be justified to secure and create privacy rights that enhance liberty, liberal ways of life, well-being and expanded opportunity. She writes: "The central theme of this book, the theme that separates it from most books about physical and informational privacy, is what I call 'unpopular' privacies" (4), that is, privacies disvalued or disliked by their targets and intended beneficiaries.

Allen reminds readers of the multiple familiar types of privacy defended in common law, statutes, tort and constitutional law, privacy that most people want, believe they have a right to, and expect government to protect for them. A lengthy yet incomplete list includes traditional tort law protection against intrusion upon seclusion such as protection from peeping Toms; publication of private facts and misappropriation of an individual's identity; broader informational privacy protecting confidentiality so that information that may be embarrassing or lead to increased scrutiny, discrimination, or other harms not be released to others for additional purposes; regulations requiring firms and medical, legal, financial and other professionals who collect personal information protect it from disclosure to third parties; as well as diverse regulations on health, education and financial data, video rentals, closed adoption records, customer cable and telecommunications data, state tax returns, electronic images and information, etc.

These regulations protect legitimate confidentiality for patients' and customers' benefit. Moreover, what Allen calls "associational" and "proprietary" privacy is protected in the First Amendment of the Bill of Rights and constitutional privacy allowing individuals to choose a marriage partner of their choice, allowing gays and lesbians to march in Boston's St. Patrick's Day parade, and undermining the Boy Scouts' decision not to allow gays to be members. The Fourth Amendment protects citizens against egregious intrusions and searches by government, and "spatial" or "physical" privacy can protect efforts to conceal oneself. The Fifth Amendment protects one against incriminating oneself, and constitutional privacy now protects bodily modesty and limits on state interferences with family, healthcare, one's sex life and personal lifestyle preferences including access to safe abortions. People want and expect protection of their informational, associational, physical and decisional privacy to flourish as human beings and to lessen their fear of increased governmental power.

Philosophers and legal theorists have defended the value of protecting these generally accepted types of privacy on various grounds, including protection of an individual's self respect and self worth, along with relationships of trust and the ability to live as one wishes, free from deception, eavesdropping, scrutiny, discrimination, pressure to conform and more. In Allen's words,

philosophers continue to maintain that privacy is of special value. Privacy, they say, is key to personality development and moral autonomy; personal honor, dignity, identity, creativity, and innovation; psychological well-being, intimacy, and family; civic association, religious expression and ideals of a limited, tolerant government . . . [all] claims amenable to serious defense (20).

But if Allen is correct that privacy is not just a "routine good", then how can one justify imposing some privacy on citizens? In some cases, she argues, when citizens make self-defeating choices, then there can be privacies that are liberating and not dominating.

The "relatively weak, soft, and non-intrusive" type of paternalism that Allen is endorsing protects only "essential" privacies unattainable through more practical and non-coercive measures, privacies that individuals will "need for a lifetime of self-respect, trusting relationships, positions of responsibility, and other forms of flourishing" (13). Allen believes her work extends the debate in feminist literature about the importance of balancing freedom from unwanted privacy rights with duties of privacy (20). A liberal egalitarian democracy demands privacy as a way to preserve self-respect, respect for other persons, personal trust, personal dignity and integrity. "Imposing privacy is disallowing people to demean their self-worth by yielding appropriate concern for the formation of reputation and self-concept" (15). Privacy institutions and practices help sustain capable free agents who are crucial for liberal democracy. Unpopular privacy can be mandated to promote ideals of freedom, good government, and to protect prominent persons as well as ordinary men, women and children. Laws mandating privacies account for and incorporate the values of individual independence and non-domination in a context of supportive interpersonal relationships. In reviewing physical privacies Allen discusses home seclusion, isolation and confinement for punitive and health reasons, and a range of other concerns from religious modesty attire to erotic nudity. The information privacy she addresses includes workplace and professional confidentiality, racial privacy, the collection, use and storage of electronic data and online transactions, and social networking. Consider some of her conclusions.

While we are used to imposed and unwanted seclusion for imprisonment, and quarantine for infectious diseases or dangerous mental illness, we tend not to think of these as privacy coercions, perhaps because all are justified by Mill's harm principle. But when corporate self-regulation failed and massive telemarketing continued, the United States Federal Trade Commission instituted a "Do Not Call" Registry list. They did not ban telemarketing calls but gave individuals who valued their privacy the ability to opt out of such phone calls, a move many applaud. For this program the default was the status quo that left those who did not mind or pay attention open to the phone intrusions. Yet Allen suggests the default might better have been the opposite. "The severity of the problem of uninterrupted lives was sufficiently great in my view to warrant a categorical ban on telemarketing calls or an opt-in 'calls permitted' registry" (37). Many people did not realize the sacrifice of privacy in answering continuous and sometimes fraudulent calls. The government, according to Allen, could have in this context paternalistically spared those people the need to make ongoing and unimportant choices.

Concealment bans in France and other European nations that prevent women from wearing Muslim apparel such as hajib and burqas, often leading to discrimination, are paternalistic, anti-privacy and anti-multicultural. By contrast, in the United States bodily concealment is constitutionally protected even when unpopular, following earlier cases that did not require assimilation. Even for school uniforms (although usually not the military) exceptions are likely for religious and cultural garb, preserving clothing choice as a domain of privacy for American women. In contrast, public nudity is forbidden in the United States, even if it is not lewd. Total nude dancing has been rejected in recent cases on grounds of moralism and the problem of harm due to "secondary effects" such as associated crime, drug use and prostitution.

Allen finds herself caught walking a tightrope here. She seems to support rare coercion of sexual modesty when the conditions of work in strip clubs, for example, are unfair, subordinating and exploitative, and when the nude dancing is degrading, dehumanizing and undignified, as well as demeaning to both customers and performers (91, 93). But Allen also believes government should try to protect women's free modesty choices, arguing that coerced modesty is a tool of subordination. Thus she supports as correct the direction of American courts in decriminalizing nude dancing (95). She insists modesty coercion must be rare, and so presumably she only endorses it when work conditions are demeaning and harmful. But it is difficult to see how to have it both ways, and how to distinguish cases where coercion is justified and where it is not.

Confidentiality for patients, legal clients, taxpayers, and others protects them from unauthorized disclosure that may allow domination by government or corporations. These regulations, however, may also be coercive for the professionals bound by the medical privacy guidelines in the Health Insurance Portability and Accountability Act (HIPAA, 2006) and other regulations protecting individual confidentiality, yet that balance is deemed appropriate. In such cases the coercion protects the dignity, respect, and autonomy of patients and clients. In contrast, the "Don't Ask, Don't Tell" policy enacted by Congress at the request of the Clinton administration entailed highly coerced confidentiality that did nothing to enhance individuals, and thus on Allen's view was correctly reversed (110).

Concerning the politics of sensitive data collection and electronic data transmissions, Allen dismisses bans on racial data collections. Arguing that racial privacy and anonymity have some merit, she agrees that they have been outweighed by the need to combat racial profiling, racial discrimination, and pernicious use of racial information (139). A useful racial privacy right was already established in NAACP v. Alabama (152), which determined that government cannot force even a controversial group to identify its members. Thus she supports race conscious policies that can be good for advancing public health and equal opportunity.

On the other hand, Allen believes people currently give away far too much of their privacy, especially electronically, leaving them open to insidious stored data aggregation and pernicious surveillance. She worries that caring about privacy in this context is not as popular as it should be, and while she disagrees with those who argue privacy is already gone, she has concerns about heading in that direction. Thus she defends the 2000 Children's Online Privacy Protection Act (COPPA), which binds both children under the age of 13 as well as parents, as a valuable way to protect youth who do not care about their privacy and need protection before they have lost screen images and other information that cannot be retrieved, and before they leave themselves vulnerable to exploitation given the many ways the ubiquitous network can be a threat to children. COPPA requires Internet operators provide parents with broad information about a child's internet usage and requires that parents be permitted to prohibit further use of that information any time. COPPA also binds and limits parents as targets of regulation, because "they cannot waive the protection entailed by certain COPPA requirements and prohibitions" (179). Allen does not recommend that similar online restrictions be imposed on young adults to minimize the internet culture of self-disclosure, but readers may wonder if she might endorse such regulation given her view "that some privacy should not be optional" (172).

Consider two commentary notes. First, Allen says her defense will be deontic, not consequentialist (13). I find it likely her argument is a combination of both. It is deontic in its stress on protection of respect for persons, for maintaining individual dignity and flourishing, and individuals' abilities to be autonomous to make their own choices. But it is surely also consequentialist in its stress on achieving certain goals endorsed by liberal democracies: better government with limited control over its citizens, privacy to enhance freedom, and the prevention of harm. This seems a positive result, as her arguments may thus be persuasive to both deontologists and consequentialists.

Second, it is unclear how many will be persuaded by what appears to be a defense of more government power over the individual through "modest" paternalism. But there is an analogy for Allen's argumentation. Gerald Dworkin's famous essay on paternalism demonstrates he understands J.S. Mill's rejection of paternalism for adults but also appreciates the amount of paternalistic legislation already endorsed by other theorists and multiple American laws and policies. Thus he attempts to defend a middle ground -- defending paternalism only in cases where decisions are: 1) irreversible, or 2) made under extreme psychological or sociological stress, or 3) based on misinformation and misunderstanding. Thus Dworkin defends paternalism only in cases where it may return an individual to a state of physical and mental health so the individual can again be able to make autonomous choices without paternalistic intervention. Similarly, Allen is willing to justify some modest paternalism to protect individuals before they have lost their dignity, self-respect, and ability to take advantage of the liberty that privacy protection gains for them, to protect them before they have irreversibly lost privacy they will need to flourish in a liberal democracy, and to maintain their ability to return to function in responsible ways without having given away what they may never reclaim.

In sum, Allen believes "we may be unwisely indifferent to our own privacy" (196), that some privacy should not be optional or waivable, and that privacy is appropriately coerced in some contexts. Yet her examples of a default change on the "Do Not Call" registry, her endorsement of coerced data protection for children on the Internet through COPPA, and her use of coerced privacy as a good reason for striking down "Don't Ask, Don't Tell" do not lead to conclusions that endorse as much governmental paternalism and mandated privacy as she leads readers to expect. Her conclusions are actually more constrained:

there can be virtue in voluntary seclusion and concealment, but injury in forced isolation, closeting and selective moralism . . . [and] there can be pragmatism in confidentiality, plus prudence and dignity in limiting access to personal information and electronic communications. (196)

Allen is surely correct that "privacy is too important to be left entirely to chance and taste", but it is less clear what exactly are the laws we need "that require government to help create and preserve forms of privacy to which we may be unwisely indifferent that are nonetheless important to lives of opportunity promised by a free and democratic society" (196). Allen concludes, "I have tried in this book to engage readers in a sustained reflection about moral and political values that inform privacy law and policy" (196). She has certainly done that and more.